A Syncretistic Theory of Depiction

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Alberto Voltolini, A Syncretistic Theory of Depiction, Palgrave Macmillan, 2015, 269pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137263285.

Reviewed by Elisa Caldarola, Università di Padova/University of Maryland, College Park


In this book, Alberto Voltolini puts forward a new theory of depiction, integrating elements from other available accounts. Because of the "syncretistic" character of his proposal, he dedicates Part I to a detailed analysis of the main accounts on offer, including a thorough investigation of the notion of seeing-in. As a consequence, the book also works as an accurate introduction to theories of depiction, perhaps the most complete currently available. Voltolini's original proposal is outlined and defended in Part II: it provides an extensive theory of depiction, which can also deal with specific issues such as inflected seeing-in, the depiction of impossibilia, sculptural depiction, and pictures in sensory modalities other than vision. The result is refreshing. Because of its multifaceted nature, however, the theory put forward is rather complex -- an aspect accentuated by Voltolini's tightly packed arguments. The exposition may have benefited from a slower argumentative pace.

To understand Voltolini's proposal, it is first and foremost necessary to grasp the notion of grouping properties, the key new element he introduces among the tools of depiction theories (chapter 6). Voltolini argues that, when looking at a depiction, we grasp not only the colors and forms of its vehicle (the pictorial surface), but also "the properties [of the elements of its vehicle] of being arranged in a certain way" (p. 128), i.e. their grouping properties, which are a kind of weakly mind-dependent property, akin to the Gestalt qualities introduced by Christian von Ehrenfels in the late nineteenth century.

As for his central argument, Voltolini claims that for an image to be a depiction it is necessary and sufficient that the three following conditions be jointly satisfied: (i) there must be "objective resemblance in grouping properties between a picture's vehicle and what is seen in it" (p. 164); (ii) such grouping properties must be grasped in the picture's vehicle by means of experiencing a certain seeing-in state; (iii) the picture's vehicle must have, with the specific individual or the individual of a certain kind it depicts, the right causal/intentional relation -- photographs and mirror images, for instance, are in a causal relation with their subject, while oil paintings are in an intentional relation with it, a relation grounded in "a certain negotiation among members of a community" (p. 165). Given the first condition, there is an affinity between Voltolini's view and objective resemblance theories of depiction, such as that of John Hyman (see chapter 3). The second condition shows that the syncretist's is also a Wollheimian theory (see chapters 4 and 5). The third condition introduces an element of conventionality, which the syncretistic theory shares with semiotic or structuralist approaches to depiction, such as those of Nelson Goodman and John Kulvicki (see chapter 2). The syncretistic proposal has also affinities with some aspects of Ernst Gombrich's illusion theory of depiction, Kendall Walton's make-believe theory, Robert Hopkins' experienced resemblance theory, and Dominic Lopes' recognition theory -- all discussed in chapters 3 and 4.

In chapter 1 it is explained that conditions (i) and (ii) account for the figurativity of depictions, i.e. for the fact that further items/scenes can be discerned in them, while condition (iii) accounts for the representational character of depictions, i.e. for their intentionality, both qua objects that are about something else and qua objects that have a content whose accuracy can be assessed -- note that Voltolini holds the view that non-mental things (e.g. a mirror image) can exhibit original intentionality (i.e. intentionality that is not derived from that of human beings). The figurative character of depiction, he stresses, constrains its representational content: in a depiction many things can be discerned, and what the depiction represents is a selection from its figurative content. Voltolini's main task is to provide an account of how pictures acquire their figurative value, which can also explain how figurativity constrains representationality in depiction.

Voltolini's core claims are put forward in chapter 6. He argues that a picture has not only basic configurational properties, but also grouping properties. Both are objective, but only the former have physical reality. The idea that grouping properties are necessary to explain depiction is the main original element in the syncretistic account, and it allows for reconciling aspects of theories usually conceived as alternatives to one another. On the one hand, Voltolini argues,

grasping certain grouping properties of the picture's vehicle is relevant for providing that vehicle with a certain figurative value only insofar as those properties are approximately the same as the grouping properties of the very item constituting that picture's figurative content (p. 160).

There are, then, objective resemblances between the surfaces and the figurative content of pictures. On the other hand, grouping properties allow Voltolini to defend a seeing-in account of depiction that is capable of explaining how it is that we perceive a two-dimensional thing and knowingly have the illusion that we are seeing another, three-dimensional thing: this is because it is once properties of the two-dimensional pictorial vehicle are grouped in three dimensions that the vehicle acquires figurative value.

Voltolini embraces Wollheim's distinction between a configurational and a recognitional aspect in seeing-in (Voltolini speaks of a configurational and a recognitional fold). However, contra Wollheim, he understands seeing-in as a mental state, rather than as an experience, observing that there can also be unconscious seeing-in (p. 127). In chapter 5 Voltolini seeks to clarify the distinction between the two folds. The marks on the surface of a picture, as well as their grouping properties, are the content of the configurational fold, a content the viewer feels as present. The recognitional fold's content is the picture's figurative content, a certain scene that emerges thanks to the grouping of the content of the configurational fold: such scene is seen as present, but this is an illusion the viewer is aware of thanks to her experience of the configurational fold. Therefore, while the scene seen in a depiction is given as present, it is not felt as present. This -- Voltolini argues -- is why experiencing a picture as twofold does not imply that we feel as if we were perceiving two incompatible objects at the same time despite the fact that the contents of the two folds of seeing-in are incompatible. His understanding of seeing-in differs from other attempts at clarifying the notion, and especially from Hopkins' attempt, where the contents of the two folds of seeing-in are not conceived as incompatible with one another. Voltolini shows how his view, despite the claim concerning the incompatibility of the contents of the two folds, can also offer an alternative to Hopkins' account of the phenomenon of inflected seeing-in, where certain properties of the item seen in a picture (the content of the recognitional fold) are seen qua properties of the design of such picture (the content of the configurational fold).

Voltolini stresses that the representational content of a depiction is not identical with its figurative content, but is rather a selection from it. (He insists that this should have been also Wollheim's understanding, but acknowledges that interpreters may disagree on this point, pp. 103-105). A picture's figurative content may be representationally ambiguous because different objects can present the same grouping properties: different pictorial contents can then be assigned to a picture with a certain figurative content. In a given depiction, its representational content is constrained by its figurative content because it is selected from it, and the picture's author can expect a viewer to grasp its representational content provided that the viewer's background knowledge and/or contextual clues allow her to grasp the author's representational intention. Seeing Madonna or Evita Perón in a still from the movie where Madonna interprets Evita are experiences with the same phenomenology: it is authorial intentions that determine whether the still should be seen as a portrait of the actor or as a representation of the historical character. All in all, Voltolini says very little about the individuation of the representational content of depictions; the synchretistic theory -- unlike most other theories on offer -- is largely an exploration of figurativity in depiction.

Having outlined his main proposal, Voltolini proceeds to show how it can be applied to sculptural representation and, potentially, to representation in other sense modalities (chapter 7). The book ends with a discussion of pictures of impossible objects (chapter 8). Voltolini observes that since impossible objects (e.g. the Penrose triangle), being nonexistent, lack both perceivable properties and merely possible perceivable properties, they also lack grouping properties. It follows that impossible objects cannot be depicted because there is no pictorial surface whose grouping properties would resemble those of an impossible object, since the latter properties do not and cannot exist. How should we characterize, then, pictures such as the Penrose triangle or the devil's fork? Voltolini doesn't follow the traditional strategy, consisting in claiming that impossible pictures have parts, which are each a depiction of some possible object; instead, he holds that such pictures are simply not depictions.

The success of Voltolini's proposal largely depends on the correctness of his construal of seeing-in and of the claim that seeing-in and resemblance in grouping properties are both necessary and jointly sufficient conditions of figurativity. I find his proposal for the construal of seeing-in carefully developed and illuminating. As for the necessity of seeing-in and grouping for depiction, however, I am not entirely persuaded. While the explanatory power of his view is certainly strong (it accounts for depiction, misrepresentation, inflected seeing-in, and can even be applied to sculptural depiction and to depiction in other sensory modalities), the theory ultimately relies on the assumption that "aspect dawning" pictures are paradigmatic cases of depiction: those are "pictures that we perceive for a long while as being ordinary physical objects, but whose pictorial value we grasp suddenly, once their pictorial aspect 'dawns upon' us" (p. 67). A famous example is the black-and-white picture of a Dalmatian -- Voltolini offers a similar image, which can be seen as a depiction of horses (p. 68). He argues that the experience of such pictures as depictions can be explained in terms of a seeing-in experience where certain properties of the pictorial surface are grouped in three dimensions, and proceeds to show that the experience of all kinds of depictions can be accounted for in these terms. On the one hand, the assumption looks reasonable in light of its grounding a theory capable of doing significant explanatory work. On the other hand, one would prefer to be offered independent reasons for assuming that the kind of image which clearly is required to be the object of a particular experience in order to be seen as a depiction is the appropriate model for understanding images whose depictive character we instead grasp immediately. Voltolini makes a powerful case for a view that brings together aspects of objectivist and of subjectivist theories of depiction, but the subjectivist component dominates his account, perhaps overly so. His proposal shows that there is room to synthesize the results of different paths of research but also highlights the need to shed more light on the theoretical presuppositions of the various accounts of depiction.

To conclude, Voltolini offers not only an original and thorough theory, but also a careful introduction to the debate on depiction. His view challenges several accounts on offer and provides plenty of material for further discussion and analysis.


Gombrich, E. (1960), Art and Illusion: A Study in the Psychology of Pictorial Representation, London and New York: Phaidon.

Goodman, N. (1976, 1st ed. 1968), Languages of Art, Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett.

Hopkins, R. (1998), Picture, Image and Experience: A Philosophical Inquiry, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Hyman, J. (2006), The Objective Eye: Color, Form, and Reality in the Theory of Art, Chicago and London: Chicago University Press.

Jacob, P. (2014), "Intentionality", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Kulvicki, J. (2006), On Images. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Lopes, D. (1996), Understanding Pictures. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Walton, K. (1990), Mimesis as Make-Believe. Cambridge MA and London: Harvard University Press.

Wollheim, R. (1987), Painting as an Art, London: Thames and Hudson.