A Tenth of a Second: A History

Placeholder book cover

Jimena Canales, A Tenth of a Second: A History, University of Chicago Press, 2009, 269pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226093185.

Reviewed by Val Dusek, University of New Hampshire


This work by a Harvard historian of science discusses the personal equation in astronomy, reaction times as studied by experimental psychology, early photography (both still and cinema), the experientially-oriented critiques of physics of Mach and Duhem, and, finally, the Bergson-Einstein debate concerning simultaneity and the twin paradox.

Canales' book contains a great deal of material of interest to philosophers, including philosophers of psychology, the history of physics, and technology, as well as phenomenologists of time consciousness. The material on the personal equation and on photography has not been worked on to any great extent by recent philosophers. The author very extensively references the literature in astronomy and psychology, particularly in French, as well as noting influences of the vocabulary and debate concerning the personal equation on other fields. However, despite the range of the work and the philosophical interest of many of the topics, Canales does not discuss the philosophical debates in the early twentieth century concerning the specious present and the analysis of time consciousness. William James is briefly mentioned, but his treatment of the specious present is not discussed. The use of James' discussion by many others, such as Niels Bohr, is not mentioned at all.

A favorable blurb from Bruno Latour as well as a few references to Deleuze and Foucault suggests the theoretical background of the work. However, such citations of French theorists are few and far between. Although the primary literature cited is primarily in French, the influence of the contemporary historian of science Peter Galison is present as well as that of Latour. Canales ties her story to the theme of hybrids breaking down the barrier between science and society. The tenth of a second issue is said to also undermine the claim that modern knowledge is superior to premodern knowledge.

In the first part of the book Canales discusses the discovery of the "personal equation" in astronomy: the small differences between the times different observers give for an astronomical event due to their reaction times and individual psychology. She gives what she calls "the standard account" of the history of the personal equation, but doesn't really replace it with a different, detailed account, though she claims that the importance of astronomy and the psychology of reaction times have been overplayed in the standard account. She points out that Théodule Ribot was the source of the standard account. Canales notes (23-24) how the story of the unfair dismissal of Nevil Maskelyn's assistant because of (then unrecognized) differences in their personal equations tied in with broader themes of justice and equality in the French Revolution and tied both to criticism of authoritarian scientists and to the need for new laboratory-based measurement. She also points out how political themes were at times linked to the story of astronomical observation. Charles Wolf in his nineteenth-century history of the Paris Observatory claims that "indiscipline" of the observatory assistants was a product of the French Revolution (98). Similarly, journalists exposed exploitation and abuse of assistants (particularly of the illustrator Étienne Trouvelet) and went on to criticize lack of accounting of funds and results by the observatories. (143-144).

Canales next discusses the 1874 and 1882 transits of Venus expeditions. (There was pressure to mount these as the next chance would not be until 2004). Measurement a century earlier had produced divergent results. The major goal of the observations was to measure the solar parallax, which would allow more accurate measurements of the dimensions of the solar system. This measurement would allow more precise testing of celestial mechanics. The disagreements concerning the measure were tied to the hypothesis of small planets near Mercury accounting for anomalies in Mercury's orbit.

The treatment of the role of photography and the shifts in attitudes of astronomers toward it (ch. 5) is particularly interesting. Initially, the development of high speed photography in the nineteenth century seemed to astronomers to promise avoidance of the problems of the personal equation and individual differences of observation. However, disappointment soon set in. Different cameras gave different results on the transit of Venus. Jansen had a camera, the "revolver," which stirred interest but was finally rejected by the commission. Jansen was forced to finance his own return from the expedition.

One feature of the use of photography in astronomy was the extensive use of military language that accompanied it. Comparisons were made to snipers, and the application of the new optical technology was recommended to the military. Canales notes that there was extensive collaboration with the navy in the Venus expeditions.

The early scientific photographer Marey rejected editing of images and also insisted the cinematic camera and projector should be one. He rejected the move of popular movie entertainers to separate the two. The popularity of moving image entertainments caused scientists to reject the use of the cinema in astronomy.

Long after the development of photography, astronomers supplemented photos with drawings.

The development of the popular Lumiere camera and its use in entertainment led to a split between science and th art of photography. Astronomers dropped use of the camera in the early twentieth century and rejected the Pathé's offers of support and free film. Some histories of the cinema later rejected any role of science in the origins of cinemaphotography.

Toward the end of the century, developments by J. B. L. Foucault, Alfred Cornu and Albert Michelson led to the replacement of astronomical observation by laboratory measurements of the speed of light. Urban centers of calculation replaced astronomical expeditions. Physics took precedence over astronomy in the determination of physical constants.

Canales discusses Mach and Duhem since they both refer to the tenth of a second. Mach uses it in his denial of an absolute separation of physics and psychology, while Duhem uses it as part of his case for the theory-laden nature of observations. Canales portrays them both as "retrograde" (177) scientists (noting their denial of the reality of atoms) because of their emphasis on the role of direct experience in physics and their emphasis on the role of psychological factors in physical observation. She correctly notes their influence in the philosophy of science but neglects the influence of Mach on Einstein, whom Canales mainly ties to the denial of the role of the personal in physical observation. She does not refer to the later twentieth-century attempts to emphasize the role of the observer in quantum physics.

Canales ends with an account of the debate between Bergson and Einstein in which a few references to the tenth of a second or the personal equation occur, although they are not central to the debate. A psychologist participant, Henri Piéron, in a public confrontation referred to the personal equation. Bergson refers to it in a late essay. However, Canales surprisingly does relatively little with Bergson's reference to the cinema as a model for time consciousness. (She neglects the story that Bertrand Russell, who had never seen a film, went to one only to examine Bergson's analogy.) The main focus in the present account is the debate concerning the twin paradox. Canales defends Bergson against misrepresentations that he denied that speeding objects have time dilation. However, he does not defend Bergson against Einstein's main criticisms.

Canales notes that in the presentation of Einstein's Nobel Prize one reason given that the prize was not awarded for relativity but for the photoelectric effect was that relativity was linked to the Bergson debate and epistemological issues. One may speculate Einstein was annoyed with this.

Canales discusses political as well as the conceptual debate. After WWI German scientists were excluded by much of the international community. Einstein, as an internationalist and a pacifist was invited to presentations in France. The second encounter of Bergson and Einstein occurred at the International Commission for Intellectual Cooperation of the League of Nations. Bergson had been active in involving the US in WWI. During the war he opposed the expulsion of Germans from the Institut de France. Einstein joined the commission but chafed at anti-German sentiments within it. He soon resigned. Einstein rejoined the next year in response to pleas. However, he soon was angry at the Commission's moving its office to Paris. Bergson resigned for health reasons and Einstein attended meetings only very rarely.

In the conclusion Canales notes that both Karl Popper and Michael Polanyi appealed to the personal equation to support their respective positions. Popper appealed to it to note the intersubjective nature of science, involving the comparison of observation reports. Polanyi appealed to it to illustrate the need for interpretation and judgment in science.

Canales' account contains a rich trove of literature from a variety of fields that refers to the tenth of a second, reaction time, or the personal equation. Unfortunately, she does not discuss the philosophical literature on time consciousness that involves the tenth of a second. Surprisingly, William James is briefly mentioned but James' analysis of the "stream of consciousness" and of time perception, the "substantive" and "transitive" parts of thought, are not discussed.[1] The so-called "specious present" and the philosophical discussion of it are not treated. The use of James' account by others with respect to the description of time consciousness is not mentioned. Likewise, the role of James' account of time consciousness in the development of Niels Bohr's account of the complementarity of the continuous and discontinuous nature of the electron in quantum theory is not mentioned.[2] An ironic consequence of Bohr's philosophizing was when some psychologists took up Bohr's complementarity as a model of time consciousness, unaware that Bohr himself was influenced by James' account.[3] More recently, some psychologists have applied complementarity to psychology with awareness of the psychological roots of Bohr's idea. Similarly, Canales does not mention other extrapolations of the notion of the specious present and the atomic nature of time in metaphysics and in physics, such as A. N. Whitehead's "drops of becoming" or speculations by some physicists about the "chronon" as a quantized unit of time.

The philosophical reader will have to make his or her own applications and extrapolations from the rich historical survey and large number of references presented in this work.

[1] William James, The Principles of Psychology, NY: Dover Publications, Inc. 1950, pp. 602-608.

[2] Max Jammer, The Conceptual Development of Quantum Mechanics, NY: McGraw Hill Book Co., 1967, pp. 172-174. Aage Petersen, Quantum Mechanics and the Philosophical Tradition, NY: Belfer Graduate School, Yeshiva University, 1968.

[3] A. E. Fessard, "Mechanisms of Nervous Integration and Conscious Experience," in J. F. Delafresnaye, ed., Brain Mechanisms and Consciousness, Oxford: Blackwell Scientific Publications, 1954, pp. 200-235.