A Theory of Freedom: From the Psychology to the Politics of Agency

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Pettit, Philip, A Theory of Freedom: From the Psychology to the Politics of Agency, Oxford University Press, 2001, 240pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-19-521832-9.

Reviewed by Jennifer A. Rosner, Mount Holyoke College


In this expansive book, Philip Pettit aims to provide a theory of freedom that will connect the domain of individual freedom and the domain of political liberty. Pettit’s attention spans from the personal, psychological features of agency constitutive of free will to the social, relational aspects of agency constitutive of political freedom. The value of Pettit’s broad and integrative aim cannot be overestimated, as contemporary writings on freedom found in ethics, moral psychology, and political philosophy tend to disconnect these domains and focus on one or the other exclusively. Such exclusivity leads to accounts of individual freedom that do not make adequate sense of threats to freedom rooted in social structures or dynamics, and to political accounts that do not make adequate sense of threats to freedom rooted in an agent’s psychology. The promise to give a single account that will span across the psychological and political domains of human agency is a most welcome one.

Pettit starts with a conceptualization of freedom as fitness to be held responsible – in Strawsonian terms, fitness to be a worthy recipient of reactive attitudes such as resentment, gratitude, and the like. Pettit takes fitness for responsibility to be theoretically constituted by “discursive control”, which involves both ratiocinative and relational capacities to engage in non-dominative discourse with others. His view provides a standpoint from which to move from the individual, psychological domain of freedom to the social domains of collectivization, politicization, and democratization. Pettit’s book has seven chapters, the first four of which are devoted to exploring what makes an individual fit to be held responsible. Pettit argues against the sufficiency of rational and volitional control theories, and ultimately defends a theory of freedom constituted by discursive control. Pettit then moves, in the last three chapters, to address explicitly political concerns. One such concern is how the state is to be guided in its responsibility for furthering people’s enjoyment of freedom as discursive control. Here Pettit argues for support of the republican ideal of non-domination. In addition, he argues that democratization will serve as the best protection of discursive control.

Pettit offers numerous considerations for conceptualizing freedom as fitness to be held responsible. The weight of these considerations is supposed to prevail over the long haul of the book, particularly as the responsibility conceptualization enables Pettit to give a singular theory that connects and unifies the individual and political domains of freedom in various ways. Despite this clear advantage, it is my view that the conceptualization of freedom as fitness for responsibility is under-argued for, and its service as a starting point, given the lack of substantive argument, undermines Pettit’s overarching project to a considerable extent. I develop this criticism below.

As Pettit carves up the specific territory to be discussed, freedom in the agent contrasts with freedom in the environment. Freedom in the agent has three aspects: (i) the freedom of the action performed by the agent; (ii) the freedom of the self implicit in the agent’s ability to identify with the things thereby done, rather than having to look on them as a bystander; and (iii) the freedom of the person involved in enjoying a social status that makes the action truly her own, not an action produced under pressure by others. (p.4) Freedom in the environment is a function of how many and significant the agent’s options are.

In addition, Pettit recognizes three “connotations” of freedom: (i) responsibility: the agent can be rightly held responsible for what he or she did; (ii. ownership: the action is one that the agent can own or identify with; and (iii) underdetermination: the agent’s choice was not fully determined at least by certain sorts of antecedents (e.g., hypnotic suggestion). (p.6) Associated with these are three “conundrums” of freedom: recursiveness, alienation, and alternate possibilities.

Pettit seeks to locate a single concept that unifies talk of freedom across the three domains of action, self, and person. He identifies this concept to be fitness for responsibility, theoretically constituted by discursive control. While Pettit seeks to preserve all three connotations of freedom (responsibility, ownership, and underdetermination) and to solve all three conundrums associated with these connotations, he prioritizes the responsibility connotation, taking it to be the most basic way we apply the concept of freedom. More pointedly, Pettit takes freedom to be equated with a person’s being fit to be held responsible (and to be authorized as a partner in interaction).

Pettit’s main argument for the prioritization of the responsibility connotation starts with the intuition that freedom connotes responsibility (the intuition that “there is no sense in the thought that while someone did something freely, still they cannot be held responsible for it” p.18). Pettit argues that there is no way of saving this intuition other than by representing our concept of being free as the concept of being responsible. Conceptualizations of freedom that prioritize the other connotations (the connotations of ownership and underdetermination) do not (or need not) save the responsibility connotation; whereas the conceptualization of freedom as fitness for responsibility saves both ownership and underdetermination. There are several things to notice here. The responsibility connotation may “save” the other connotations because it is parasitic on them – we hold an agent responsible for particular actions because the agent owns or identifies with her actions, and because the agent could have done otherwise than she did. The connotations of ownership and underdetermination may not in turn save the responsibility connotation because they extend beyond it: there are arguably cases of ownership and underdetermination that connote freedom in the absence of responsibility. Pettit denies that fitness for responsibility and freedom can come apart or fail to coincide in degree (p.86); but this does not ring true. In ordinary practice anyway, fracturings of mind or heart have to be extreme before they erode fitness for responsibility, but not before they erode freedom (e.g., as ownership). (Compare the threshold level required in order for ambivalence or disavowal to signal a failure of identification or ownership, with that required to undermine fitness for responsibility.) Perhaps this is because we operate with a conceptualization of freedom that is richer than “fitness to be held responsible”.

Pettit locates further support for the prioritization of the responsibility connotation of freedom in the principle that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’. Our deeply rooted practices of addressing ‘oughts’ to one another, and holding one another responsible for our actions, rest on the supposition that we are freely able to do what we ought. Responsibility connotes freedom, insofar as the ‘oughts’ we hold each other responsible for fulfilling imply the ‘can’ of freedom. (p.18) The trouble with this line of argument is that it confines freedom to the realm of the moral; it takes the ‘can’ of freedom (a seemingly neutral ‘can’) to be essentially moral, deriving from the ‘ought’ of responsibility. The legitimacy of this line of argument can be challenged by those who take freedom to include the expression of individualistic, and not necessarily moral, standards. [See Frankfurt, “The Importance of What We Care About,” in The Importance of What We Care About, Cambridge University Press, 1988, pp.80-94, and “Autonomy, Necessity, and Love,” in Necessity, Volition, and Love, Cambridge University Press, 1998, pp.129-141.]

The considerations Pettit offers in favor of conceptualizing freedom as fitness for responsibility are, I submit, too weak to justify his methodological strategy of prioritizing the responsibility connotation. Operating from what is essentially an assumption that freedom is properly conceived as fitness for responsibility, Pettit’s central project is to say what theoretically constitutes such fitness. Pettit critically assesses two contending theories: the theory of freedom defended by Donald Davidson, which casts freedom as a form of rational control, and the theory of freedom developed by Harry Frankfurt, which casts freedom as a form of volitional control. In the chapters addressing these theories, Pettit puts forth several insightful criticisms that will be instructive in the freedom debate. However, the central focus of his critical task concerns how well (or badly) the theories support the responsibility connotation. The power of Pettit’s criticism in this vein is diminished by the fact that the prioritization of the responsibility connotation is itself an under-argued for focal point, and by the fact that support for the responsibility connotation is (admittedly) not a primary aim of either the rational control theory or the volitional control theory.

Pettit’s own ensuing theory of freedom as discursive control is innovative and interesting, and insofar as it has a social aspect, it has ready application to issues of political freedom. Pettit takes one to have the status of a free person in relation to others by virtue of a capacity for discursive interaction – interaction through which individuals come to a common mind via reason-based discourse. Discursive control requires not just particular psychological capacities; it also requires relational capacities. In addition, it requires that others relate to one in a certain way, authorizing one as worthy of address. That one’s freedom depends at least to some extent on one’s dynamical relations with others is obvious when we focus on particular freedom-undermining factors (e.g., domination and servility). It is a significant advantage of Pettit’s account that it can accommodate such social facts, where many theories of individual freedom cannot, as they do not extend past the individual agent’s psychological capacities.

The discursive-control theory tells us what is required for fitness for responsibility, or, as Pettit qualifies his view, proper fitness for responsibility. (p.16) Pettit is seemingly optimistic that our ordinary practices of holding responsible are largely free of convolution; for he does not offer specific details as to what proper practices of holding one another responsible might be like. The less optimistic may prefer more detail on this point. Moreover, a view that is rooted in our ordinary practices of holding one another responsible will want to consider how such practices are challenged by the notion of moral luck. Pettit claims that the central conundrum associated with the responsibility connotation of freedom is recursiveness: if one is to be responsible for one’s actions, one must be responsible for the beliefs and desires that lead to one’s actions, and for the habits of believing and desiring that lead to the formation of one’s beliefs and desires, and so on. (p.11) That much of what we do (and believe and desire) is due to much that we do not do (or believe or desire), but rather is due to influences out of our control with lucky or unlucky result, poses a challenge to our practices of holding one another responsible and to the very idea of “fitness for responsibility.”[See Nagel, “Moral Luck,” in Mortal Questions, Cambridge University Press, 1979, pp.24-38.] Pettit suggests a solution to the recursive problem: he claims that an agent can be fit to be held responsible for something (be it an action, or belief, or whatever), in virtue of being of a certain type – a reason-responsive type – and not in virtue of any preceding event or state. (p.98) This move may solve the recursive problem associated with responsibility, but the challenge from moral-luck theorists remain. The fact that one is (by constitution or by training) a reason-responsive type who can interact discursively is due to all sorts of influences out of one’s control with lucky or unlucky result. Practices of holding one another responsible may be deemed incoherent if one takes moral luck seriously.

Pettit admirably aims to give a theory of freedom that makes its significance to our lives clear: it readily connects the domains of individual and political freedom, while it grounds freedom in deeply rooted practices that are themselves embedded in inescapable human sentiment and response. More argumentation to support the conceptualization of freedom as fitness for responsibility would be well worth the work to see if Pettit’s innovative view is viable.