A Theory of General Ethics: Human Relationships, Nature, and the Built Environment

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Warwick Fox, A Theory of General Ethics: Human Relationships, Nature, and the Built Environment, MIT Press, 2007, 392 pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262562195.

Reviewed by Andrew Brennan, La Trobe University


Warwick Fox has set out to provide an ethical "theory of everything", one that is "general" to the extent that it spans three domains: first, biophysical nature, second, human symbolic culture, and -- third -- the material culture that is the product of applying minds and symbol systems to nature.  Such a theory is intended to give a unified account of values in all three domains -- for example, the value of human life and thought, the value of sentient animals and non-sentient natural systems, the value of forms of social organization, sporting skills and works of art.  An ethics that is "general" in the required sense can be tested, he claims, by its capacity to address eighteen specific problems (e.g. the problems of why humans are valuable, about whether abortion and euthanasia are permissible, about what is the best kind of politics, of why predation is acceptable, of why indigenous species are worth protecting, of whether life as such is valuable, and why ecosystems should be protected).  Having introduced a single, foundational value -- "responsive cohesion" -- that can be used to articulate what is morally important in each of the realms, he shows in the remainder of his book how responsive cohesion can be applied in various contexts to yield morally compelling solutions to the eighteen problems listed early in the book.  In the tenth chapter of the book he helpfully summarizes the way the theory responds to each of the eighteen problems, and in the final concluding chapter he summarizes the theory and his previous discussions in a way that clarifies his most significant claim: that any

truly general ethics must offer a coherent ethical framework … that can deal with issues that range from individual living things and living beings to whole ecological systems, from the natural environment to the human-constructed environment, and from our obligations in respect of other beings at the personal level to our obligations in respect of other beings at the political level. (p. 357)

While Fox is a well-known figure in environmental philosophy, it is surprising that the book makes no reference to any of his work published before 2000 (the year in which he edited and contributed to a collection of essays on the ethics of the built environment).  This silence may be intended to mark the break between his previous work on transpersonal ecology and the new direction of thought brought to fruition in the present volume.  Yet the past obtrudes even when not acknowledged.  For example, Fox was formerly a fan of the notion of autopoiesis -- the idea that many systems have a special quality of self-organization and self-renewal.  The notion itself is only mentioned once (p. 34) as part of a more general attack on life-based ethics.  Yet the core value-conferring property of Fox's new ethics -- responsive cohesion -- is itself a generalized or extended kind of autopoiesis.  Things, we are told on page 67, can hold together -- whether atoms, poems, strips of real estate, or relationships -- or fail to do so.  Of those things that stick together, the cause may be glue, or bolts or arbitrary building decisions.  This kind of fixed cohesion is different from responsive cohesion (p. 72) because the latter involves the elements in a structure interacting (literally or metaphorically) in a way that involves mutual modification of a kind that maintains the overall structure.   It is this kind of responsive cohesion that is the source of all moral value in all three domains: the higher the degree of responsive cohesion, the better.

The opposite of cohesion, Fox thinks, is disorder or 'discohesion' as he prefers to call it.  Strangely, he takes war (whether within the family, or between states) as a form of discohesion (p. 94), as if he has not considered the possibility that many wars, vendettas and feuds are themselves a form of structured, cohesive and -- regrettably -- prolonged dialogue among the warring parties.  Fixed cohesion, in a relationship, amounts to being "stuck in a rut", he cautions, while responsive cohesion is indicated by the idea that "we really turn each other on" (p. 94).  Again, he seems not to notice the obvious problem that abusive and dysfunctional relationships can be close, mutually maintained (for example by mutual projections from each partner onto the other) and can persist in such self-maintaining forms for a long time.  Nor does Fox discuss other obvious problems at this point: for example whether a cohesive society that maintains harmony at the expense of being tough on dissent is better than one that is less cohesive in his sense, but where individual liberties allow for more dissent, flexibility and experiment.  His preferred story is that the theory of responsive cohesion prefers democracy to all other forms of government, but it is hard to see -- in the absence of detailed argument -- why this should be.  Maybe, of course, an ethical theory should not be expected to choose between such possibilities.  Maybe there are goods and bads in each form of society.  But it seems that Fox's general ethics is committed to the bald principle that as responsive cohesion increases, then so does value, and he states -- as an almost self-evident truth -- that democracy commends itself in opposition to anarchy (discohesion) and dictatorship (fixed cohesion) (p. 95).

When applied to the problem cases with which the book opens, the responsive-cohesion theory of value apparently produces enlightened liberal judgments.  Sentient beings, for example, are more valuable than merely living ones, for sentience itself opens more possibilities for responsiveness and interaction between living things and their surroundings (pp. 334-5).  Humans, as they mature, become part of a mindsharing community, and this form of sharing opens the way to more elaborate forms of responsive cohesion than sentience itself does.  The fetus, for example, is an isolated though possibly sentient being: the potential for doing harm to it is considerably lower than the potential for doing harm to a pregnant woman as a member of the rich mindsharing community (pp. 333-9).  The liberal view on the rights and wrongs of abortion is endorsed by Fox's theory, and the same is true for the line he takes on euthanasia (pp. 339-44).  Since community incorporation is so significant, it is not surprising that companion animals -- as de facto members of the mindsharing realm -- are owed more respect than strays (p. 274), although Fox is more cautious in extending similar levels of obligation to all domesticated animals.  In their case, "the theory … favors a judicious balance of wild and domesticated living things" in light of the need to preserve "the responsive cohesion of our biophysical base context" (p. 318).  As happens throughout the book, there is no discussion of any of the obvious problems that arise here.  Take the case of companion animals.  Stray and semi-domesticated dogs all over the world seem to enjoy considerably richer lives than their heavily-trained, domesticated, and often bored city counterparts, locked indoors for much of the day and denied much contact with other dogs.  For the city dogs, de facto membership of the mindsharing community looks like a reduction, rather than an increase, in what is of value.  In the face of this kind of case, Fox might modify his claims in a number of ways.  He could, for example, accept that village dogs in Africa and Asia live richer lives than their highly-domesticated counterparts in Europe and Australasia.  If so, there are forms of responsive cohesion, and forms of mindsharing, that are valuable while lying outside the kind of mindsharing that typifies human communities.  If Fox were to admit this, then his hierarchical conception that places human communities and mindsharing at the top of the value realm would need to be revised.

This case is a symptom of a much larger problem -- namely, that the theory of responsive cohesion seems to do too much and at the same time not do enough.  As already seen, the theory can accommodate claims that are exactly the opposite of the ones Fox wants to endorse -- as shown by the example of the village dogs, and the earlier cases of feuds and dysfunctional relationships.  So where does the theory give clear guidance?  Since the notion of responsive cohesion is so defined as to be applicable metaphorically as well as literally, it seems that any kind of appropriately organized system can be described as manifesting responsive cohesion.  So any relationship, any animal, any environmental system, any architectural structure, any story, can be described in the language of responsive cohesion.  Fox scores easy victories for his theory by espousing this language in giving his preferred solutions to the moral and political problems he discusses.  But since exactly the same language can be used by those who disagree with him, the theory is too general to be of any use.

On the other hand, good sense suggests that not all organized systems are of value, and that higher degrees of mutual accommodation and structuring are not in themselves of value.  Children's friendships are often lumpy, inarticulate and comic in their lack of responsive cohesion.  By contrast, the relationship between blackmailer and victim, prolonged over many years, may be exquisitely subtle, nuanced and mutually responsive.  Responsive cohesion seems greater in the second case, while the relationship seems less morally valuable than the childhood friendship: so the language of responsive cohesion just does not do enough to justify its claim to underpin a general theory of ethics and moral value.

Apart from these large problems, the book is beset with many smaller ones.  Although it is long, it is highly repetitive, and occasionally whole paragraphs are repeated within a few pages of being introduced.  It contains egregious mistakes -- for example, when it is implied (p. 43) that Hume's theory of moral sentiments makes no room for channelling and curbing our passions.   As already noted, the book is silent on Fox's own earlier work, but it is also silent on the debts owed to other writers in the field -- for example Holmes Rolston III and J. Baird Callicott -- whose theories are drawn on and often incorporated into the general claims on behalf of responsive cohesion.  When previous writers in environmental ethics are mentioned, this is usually in order to be critical, for example, in the attack on life-centred ethics which, as he puts it,  "just chases its own tail instead of giving a solid answer to a problem" (p. 34).  If my general objection to Fox's own position is right, then exactly the same can be said about his own attempt at an ethical theory of everything.