A Written Republic: Cicero's Philosophical Politics

Placeholder book cover

Yelena Baraz, A Written Republic: Cicero's Philosophical Politics, Princeton University Press, 2012, 252pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691153322.

Reviewed by Raphael Woolf, King's College London


Why did Cicero write philosophical works? What were his motivations for doing so, and how do these relate to the justifications he offered on the page? These questions are at the centre of Baraz's study, which takes as its focus the prefaces that Cicero composed for his philosophical works, but also draws on the more intimate context of his letters, and offers as further comparison an analysis of certain contemporaneous justifications by other Roman authors for their pursuit of intellectual activity.

The latter is the point of departure of Chapter 1, in which Baraz discusses two contrasting approaches, that of Sallust and of the anonymous author of the Rhetorica ad Herennium, to the challenge of vindicating intellectual production in the face of a potentially suspicious Roman audience for whom practical, and in particular, political activity was the proper pursuit for any self-respecting member of the elite. Baraz thus characterizes what one might call (not her terminology) a 'minimalist' and a 'maximalist' approach to the defence of intellectual activity (in particular, in its written form). In the case of the Rhetorica, which exemplifies the former approach, it is portrayed as essentially belonging to one's leisure (otium). So although pictured within that as still a kind of work (negotium), thereby conferring on it some degree of worth, it is not ultimately defended as part of one's mainstream activity. Sallust, more boldly, adopts a 'maximalist' approach: a work of the intellect, in his case the writing of history, and thereby the memorialising of the past, is claimed as fitting importantly within the sweep of traditional elite Roman values.

Baraz ends the chapter by claiming that Cicero in his own philosophical defences 'vacillate[s]' (42) between these two outlooks, in part because of the multifarious nature of the audiences he was contending with. This seems a somewhat gloomy appraisal and perhaps a little hard on Cicero, who might more charitably be described as trying to reconcile various competing demands within a unified outlook and thus to knit together a position that does justice to these demands (how successfully is another question), in ways that Baraz herself will go on to indicate.

Chapter 2 examines the evidence of Cicero's letters -- a source which might bring us in some ways closer than the published works to the core of his motivation for writing philosophy. Baraz helpfully divides the material along four main lines, though there is room for overlap between them:

philosophy's practical effect: improving the actions and character of its students

philosophy as a potential alternative to or substitute for the political life, when the latter becomes untenable (as it was for Cicero during Caesar's unprecedented rule)

the place of writing, in this context primarily the writing of philosophy, within the Roman scheme of values

philosophy as consolation.

The last of these is important in context for two main reasons: Cicero's grief at the loss of his daughter Tullia in childbirth, and his anguish at the state of the Roman Republic given Caesar's ascendancy. These events are roughly contemporaneous both with each other and with the period of Cicero's most intense philosophical output. Baraz, however, is anxious to downplay the motivational importance for Cicero of the alleviation of his own personal suffering. She argues at any rate against this being his 'primary motivation' (87) and emphasizes that in his letters of consolation Cicero tailors his advocacy of the consolatory power of philosophy to the interest in philosophy (or lack thereof) of his correspondents. Yet given the importance of philosophy for Cicero, his doubtless prudent decision not to push it down the throats of correspondents who lack such interest hardly shows that a primary motivation for himself wasn't consolation.

Baraz argues that Cicero's use of the consolation motif is mainly tactical: to provide the cloak of a safer and more 'traditional' justification for philosophical activity than one in terms of its utility for statesmanship. But this seems unsatisfactory given that (as Baraz discusses) Cicero was already thought by contemporaries to be overreacting in his grief at the loss of Tullia. How much this 'softer' (93) line would in fact resonate with his intended elite readership must be open to doubt. We can (and I think should) admit that philosophy's consolatory function was important for Cicero well beyond its somewhat debatable function as a mollifying tactic, without that diminishing his adherence to its potential political utility as well.

Chapter 3 discusses the issue of 'translation' which, taken in a broad sense to capture Cicero's efforts to render Greek philosophical ideas in the Latin tongue, goes to the heart of his project. Baraz highlights a tension for Cicero (97-8) between 'domesticating' what is foreign in a way that would have no particular hold on readers who already admire Greek philosophy in the original, and 'foreignizing' the Latin language through the introduction of, e.g., a necessarily specialist vocabulary that may alienate those already distrustful of philosophy's exoticism. This reflects a more general tension in Cicero's project between the need to show that Greek philosophy can make a vital contribution in the Roman context, and the need not to be seen to displace or belittle traditional Roman values in so doing.

Baraz suggests (with particular reference to the preface of De Natura Deorum) that Cicero goes for conciliation: philosophy presented in Latin improves communication between citizens, and is thus continuous with Cicero's longstanding efforts to achieve a harmonious civic order (102). But this is still communication about philosophical ideas, presumably, and one might wonder why Cicero's readership would have found that to be necessarily a good thing. Baraz herself suggests that Cicero is 'vague' about philosophy's benefits to the state (127), notwithstanding his efforts in the preface to the Tusculan Disputations to persuade his readers that a dose of Greek philosophical theory can in fact help maintain the stability of traditional Roman values (107-8).

Cicero's difficulties in dealing with his variegated readership do not, it seems to me, require us to posit, as Baraz does, an 'ambivalence' (107) on his part about the significance of the Greek philosophical heritage. His occasional near belittling of it reflects a tension in Cicero's objective that Baraz brings out well -- between allowing that Greek philosophy has sufficient value to motivate its presentation more widely in Latin, while not giving it so much value that it would appear to vanquish Rome's own cultural heritage and thereby repel a significant portion of the intended readership. That task may itself explain differences of emphasis in different texts (or in the same text). Nor, it seems to me, do we have to see Cicero's presentation of his objectives as 'full of contradictions he never acknowledges' (127). At least I think Baraz over-extends her critique at this point with the claim that such putative contradiction 'centers, as most issues in the prefaces do, on the person of the author himself' (126). Baraz sees Cicero as envisaging an 'ideal citizen' who will have all the philosophical learning one needs through the medium of Latin; and she asks sceptically whether Cicero himself could then count as his ideal citizen given his immersion in the Greek tradition (126). The answer seems straightforward, but also unproblematic. How could he? He hasn't had a Cicero to benefit him. One might compare the figure of Socrates in Plato's Republic. He is not an ideal citizen either, since he wasn't raised in Callipolis; his role is to show the way forward to its founding. Cicero's special role (if that it be), far from being an embarrassment (let alone a contradiction) for him, surely paints him in colours he would welcome - never so happy as when able to portray his contributions as unique.

Chapter 4 discusses the role of oratory in providing leverage for Cicero to win over his readers. The deep-seated presence of oratory in Roman life, if one can make it seem continuous with philosophy, will demonstrate that the latter is not un-Roman. Baraz convincingly shows that, and how, Cicero connects the potentially alien pursuit of philosophy with the unimpeachable Roman practice of oratory. There is, as Baraz points out, a paradox here. Cicero claims that philosophy is in fact superior to rhetoric, a claim presumably made to justify the scale and depth of his interest; yet it is the one area of accomplishment in which the Romans have failed to shine. By stressing that his own oratory, pretty much incontestably the finest of its day, was in fact based on his philosophical interests, Cicero both Romanizes philosophy and presents himself as the most suitable person for disseminating it more widely. A high risk strategy to be sure, since the presentation of philosophy as a fundamental part of public practice (as opposed to occupation for one's leisure) makes it potentially more liable to alarm a reader sceptical about philosophy's role, but a perfectly cogent one.

How, exactly, is philosophy superior though? Baraz speculates that in calling it (in the preface to Tusculan Disputations) uberior, richer or 'more productive', Cicero means that while oratory produces superficial persuasion, philosophy brings about a deeper commitment in one's audience (144-5). On the other hand, the later passage from the Tusculans cited in support of this interpretation (145 n.42) seems if anything to suggest that the difficulty of philosophy is liable to produce concession rather than agreement, albeit that a richer exposition can help overcome that. I wonder, then, if philosophy's superiority for Cicero may not lie at root in its devotion to truth rather than (however far-reaching) persuasion -- which is not of course to deny that the inculcation of truth might be the most effective way of securing stable agreement. In a rather allusive concluding paragraph Baraz refers to (without elaborating on) Cicero's 'misuse' of rhetoric, from the perspective of philosophy, in his own past practice (149). Perhaps this means that truth-content is at issue. Baraz's main point is apparently that given the close relation between the two arts that Cicero is trying to establish, his supposed earlier misuse of rhetoric will unwittingly cast aspersions on philosophy too.

Chapter 5 moves from Cicero's promotion of the link between philosophy and rhetoric to his own use of rhetorical devices within the prefaces, as part of his enterprise of winning over the potentially sceptical Roman reader. Baraz plausibly and ingeniously proposes that Cicero garners his readers' support through his use of the device of the personal dedicatee. That latter relationship itself is an expression of 'friendship' (amicitia), which in Roman terms sets up a bond of mutual obligation. Cicero having performed his side of the bargain by writing and dedicating the work, the dedicatee is now expected to return the favour by regarding the work favourably. If Cicero can encourage his actual readership to identify with the dedicatee, then he has at least cleared the ground for a sympathetic hearing (or reading). Baraz makes a good case (based mainly on the Topics preface) for a Cicero who subtly manoeuvres the dedicatee into sympathy with the philosophical content to come. It remains a little obscure how exactly the reader is then supposed to identify with the dedicatee. Presumably since, as Baraz emphasizes (154-5), Cicero's intended readership would be from a similar social class and so more broadly part of the network of amicitia, the act of reading the preface would make such identification natural: any friend of yours is a friend of mine. A residual puzzle, though, is whether, if Baraz's reading is right, Cicero is left somewhat preaching to the converted. Baraz characterizes the 'ideal reader' that Cicero is writing for as, among other things, 'a man who would appreciate the importance of a real translation and integration of Greek philosophical ideas with the Roman cultural tradition'. But she also identifies this reader with Cicero's 'intended audience' (186). If so, then Cicero's project seems unexpectedly lacking in ambition.

The sixth and final chapter looks at Cicero's presentation of his philosophical project in the period after Caesar's assassination, when, now free to return to public life, it was no longer a question of his having to do, and justify doing, philosophy as an alternative to statesmanship. Here Baraz sees Cicero's philosophical persona as becoming less dialectical and more didactic at the same time as playing down the role of philosophy from a restored vantage point at the front line of politics. I don't myself see a 'devaluation' (191) of philosophy on Cicero's part to quite the extent that Baraz does. True, it has an 'ancillary' (194) role post-Caesar, but arguably that was always the case for him; one does philosophy because it has the potential to enhance the practice of statecraft and the wellbeing of the republic. All Cicero could (actively) do during Caesar's reign was write philosophy; that didn't make such writing an end in itself. I wonder if a clearer distinction by Baraz between the importance of an activity and its status as a means might have helped the discussion here. As it is, Baraz is led, I think, to overdo the sense of paradox between philosophy's ancillary position for Cicero and his growing emphasis on its more politically relevant aspects (219).

Cicero's struggle to secure a public role for philosophy in times of turmoil has a perennial fascination. Baraz's monograph is a welcome addition to the trend that sees his philosophical works as distinctive and sophisticated artefacts in their own right, worthy of study as such. If occasionally her overall assessment of Cicero's achievement seems a little less charitable than some of her own detailed analyses might imply, that itself is a tribute to the seriousness with which she takes his project, and the fluency and tenacity with which she lays out its stratagems. Baraz's book is a scholarly and stimulating read, recommended for anyone interested in Cicero, the history of philosophy, or the question of how (if at all) philosophy should relate to the messy world around us.