Action, Decision-Making and Forms of Life

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Jesús Padilla Gálvez (ed.), Action, Decision-Making and Forms of Life, De Gruyter, 2016, 173pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783110472882.

Reviewed by Niklas Forsberg, Uppsala University/University of Helsinki


This collection of conference papers, as the title indicates, focuses on Wittgenstein's notion of forms of life. A volume discussing how a Wittgenstein-inspired philosophy that brings the idea of forms of life to the contemporary philosophical debates about action and decision-making sounds like a very good idea. Something very fruitful may indeed come out of such a project. But what?

Wittgenstein's importance for philosophy of action more generally is of course unquestionable. Giants like Elisabeth Anscombe, Donald Davidson, and John McDowell (to name a few) have all drawn upon Wittgenstein's thinking in their work on this topic. But the thoughts inherent in Wittgenstein's idea of forms of life are so complicated and multifarious that its inclusion in the philosophy of action can be (or could become) quite penetrating.

Philosophers of action paradigmatically focus on singular, and supposedly concrete, "deeds" done by agents, primarily by means of intentional movements of their limbs at a particular time -- "John buttered the toast" or "Mary crossed the street." Forms of life is (obviously so) a broader notion that widens the perspective to a, let us call it, "cultural" horizon. We only butter our toast in a form of life where there are such things as breakfasts, or afternoon teas, or evening snacks. We cross the street only in the forms of life where there are streets and not just paths, where walking is common, and perhaps also where a sense of human directedness is implied in most of our doings. Mary crossed the street because of something, or for some reason – to meet a friend, go to a nice looking café, join a student who called to her, etc. So one would think that the inclusion of the notion of "form of life" would bring a complicated picture to philosophy of action and force us to think more about actions in terms of notions such as culture or horizon, and move us away from the singular event clearly visible in the movements of the physical limbs of one "agent."

For these reasons, one may be rather surprised to see that this book appears to offer a rather narrow and strict perspective. On the back cover we learn that:

The book aims to answer the question of why certain actions are carried out within specific forms of life. Every action is acquired by way of language games. With the aid of these language games the speaker introduces a regulatory scheme. This scheme can be analyzed by scrutinizing the grammar used in the language games. Language games follow specific rules that form part of the regulatory scheme. Decision-making is the result of a process in which the speaker has selected a specific language game from a range of possible alternatives.

Three things need to be said about this. First, it is rather unclear what it means. What does it, for example, really mean to say that every action is acquired by way of language games? What does "regulatory scheme" mean? And what understanding of "grammar" is here alluded to? Second, it is unclear to what extent it is possible to trace this view back to Wittgenstein. Third, the volume is a diverse collection of papers -- as is quite common with proceedings -- and not all the papers represent a philosophy that neatly falls under this description. Some of the better papers challenge, or at least contain an implicit criticism of, the view that the book as a whole aims, or claims, to present and defend.

In order to make these differences clear, and in order to bring into view what exactly is problematic with the supposed overall line of interpretation, we must look closer at some of the more confusing formulations and put them in relation to what is described as the overall aim of the book: explaining "why certain actions are carried out within specific forms of life." I will focus on some of the papers that highlight this tension, and I am therefore forced to ignore other papers that also deserve comment.

The view presented by the editor, also argued for in his own paper "Action and Decision-Making" is, at least in some respects, rather systematic. An action is a part of a language game. As such, it is rule-governed in some sense. Action, in Gálvez's view, "is related to a set of language games (predicative function) and it is embedded in a form of life" (61). Since Galvez's also ties the notion of language game to rules, explaining human action becomes a matter of conducting a "systematic examination of the linguistic rules applied to the expressions by which these actions are described" (62). From Gálvez's introduction we learn that "an action is based on the language game used in the course of this action.  . . .  It is the action that emerges from the language game and not the language game that develops from an action" (4). This, supposedly, suggests that any human action is somehow best seen as the outcome of, or the product of, a language game. Language games, in turn, are supposedly elements of a form of life. And a form of life is grammatically structured. Thus, if we study the rules of grammar we will understand human action. This is, I take it, the general view that Gálvez suggests.

But this view depends on rather peculiar readings of the central concepts involved. What, after all, does it really mean to say that an action, any action, "emerges from a language game"? Are not games played, that is, acted out in some way or other? How, exactly, are we to think about this particular inflection of the concept? We play, that is, act and talk, and then human actions "emerge"?

Similar worries can be raised with regard to the concept "rule." Gálvez maintains that "an analysis of the concept 'action' requires a systematic examination of the linguistic rules applied to the expressions by which these actions are described" (62). Now, there are (at least) two ways one may interpret this. One is to say that rules govern the uses of our words in such a way that the rules determine what is possible to say, and therefore (?) what courses of action are possible for us. This would be in line with a more traditional reading of Wittgenstein where grammatical rules are thought of as those which one must obey if one is to speak meaningfully -- only, now with the addition "speak and act meaningfully." From this way of reading Wittgenstein, it follows that linguistic sense is, as it were, not "up to us" in any richer sense than it is up to us to obey the rules of language or not.

One problem with such a reading is that Wittgenstein's way of talking about forms of life tends to enter his investigations precisely at the point one may be tempted to think that sense must be guaranteed "objectively," externally and rooted in something over and above human practices. This would have one believe that the regularity we find in language, and also the normative force these kinds of regularities bring about, are not to be discerned as a form of calculus that we follow, or adhere to. That is, when Wittgenstein says that to "represent a language is to represent a form of life" (Philosophical Investigations, § 19; quoted in Gálvez, 73), he could be read as challenging the idea that knowing how to speak is the same thing as knowing what rule to apply. And there are moments where Gálvez appears to move towards a more open, flexible notion of form of life which would include serious challenges to more traditional ways of thinking about linguistic competence in terms of rule following.

But it remains unclear which way Gálvez is going here. Are actions to be explained as obedience to pre-existing rules, or are actions better elucidated in terms of a culture's way of life, where human interaction produces regularities in both words and deeds? Gálvez seems to be heading towards the latter alternative when he says that "agreement among individuals is conducted in language and what is right or wrong does not depend on point of view but on a common form of life" (72). But then again, the paper ends with this perplexing claim: "Our form of life gives normative structure to our habits and customs. These customs are of prescriptive nature and exert pressure on every member of society. Citizens who refuse corporative rules are eventually excluded from society" (74).

This is a baffling claim. I see nothing in this formulation of Wittgenstein's struggle to bring thinking back to the rough ground, to show that thoughts and habits do not depend on something over and above them, that supports the view that the regularities we see in language use are tacit agreements in habits -- and not matters of obedience. This view is presented as Wittgenstein's and as something that the book, as a whole, "argues." I do not think that this view is Wittgenstein's. But it is also not true that the rest of this book further substantiates Gálvez's reading.

Margit Gaffal's "Actions Embedded in Forms of Life" presents a view similar to Gálvez's. She claims that "Our language games constitute the framework of our conduct" (47) and that "language games constitute verbal patterns that we employ when we engage in social activities" (49). So it becomes an issue for her whether or not one may act in unexpected ways. We are, Gaffal suggests, controlled and limited by the set of language games that we have inherited (or chosen?). If we want to act and think differently, the best we can do is to modify the existing regulatory schemes (55). Of course, Gaffal does not argue (or claim that Wittgenstein argues) that language is static. Rather, she emphasizes that language is dynamic. But in Gaffal's view that merely means that a person may introduce (or be introduced to?) new language games. "Form of life," according to this picture, just is the totality of a person's language games (52). This gives us the picture of a framed human being: "Considerations on the limits of possibilities of a person's adaptability raise the question of whether one could actually escape from a form of life. Could one, for instance, renounce his or her form of life and replace it with another?" (52-3). Our lives in language, including human actions and interactions, are again described as a form of outcome; a result. "Language games" are presented as something similar to programs that cause us to hold beliefs. As a reading of Wittgenstein, this is deeply problematic. And one cannot but wonder about where we are supposed to be placed when we think about whether or not to renounce this form of life and chose another.

But there are several papers that argue for a very different line of interpretation. Severin Schroeder's "Intuition, Decision, Compulsion," -- in my view, one of the best papers in the collection -- can be well described as offering a counter-argument to the alleged thesis. Schroeder also starts from a reflection upon Wittgenstein's views about what it means to follow a rule, and what it means to act according to one. But Gálvez and Gaffal argue that regularity in speech and interaction must, in the last analysis, come down to a form of obedience to externally existing, prescriptive, "grammatical" rules. Schroeder rather emphasizes the many passages where Wittgenstein suggests, not only that there is not much sense in talking about a set of rules that preexists and governs all our uses of words and all our actions, but also that even the idea that following a rule is done on the basis of a decision is problematic. Going on as before (following a rule) is more "spontaneous" -- something we do blindly -- neither by "intuition" nor by willed decisions. Schroeder thus makes clear that following a rule is not a matter of choice. And this casts a rather different light on the complexity of the habitual living that Wittgensteinean reflections on the idea of "forms of life" may bring to the philosophy of action. If nothing else, this addition clearly complicates things, and it does so precisely by challenging the view of what it means to act according to a rule that Gálvez and Gaffal defend. Schroeder says something very important when he notes that Wittgenstein's way of thinking about rules challenges a way of thinking of rules that may be "so deeply rooted in one's mind that Wittgenstein's objections to it sound like an attack on the very possibility of following a rule" (32). This challenge is precisely what seems to go unnoticed in the "official story" of this book.

Modesto Gómez-Alonso discusses Schopenhauer's influence on Wittgenstein's philosophy. This paper is interesting and contains a great deal of thoughtful observations that are put in relation to contemporary positions in the philosophy of action. Gómez-Alonso argues that Wittgenstein can help us see what is confused in the idea that the will is an event. Rather, he argues, the will is better seen as "something akin to the atmosphere round a situation" (91). Here, notions like language games and forms of life come in, not as regulatory ideals, but as a space of action, as something "taken for granted" in a sense related to "conditions of possibility." And this is the kind of thinking that broadens the contemporary philosophy of action in interesting ways.

We might say that we should not judge a book by its cover. But in this case we must take issue with the view there presented because it gives its prospective readers the impression that this anthology presents one coherent view that Wittgenstein held and that the papers book substantiate. None of that is correct—at least not without substantial reservations or clarifications. This book is, as proceedings generally are, diverse. But as one puts the book down one cannot but feel that it contains more arguments against the claim on its cover than arguments for it.