Adam Smith's Pluralism: Rationality, Education, and the Moral Sentiments

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Jack Russell Weinstein, Adam Smith's Pluralism: Rationality, Education, and the Moral Sentiments, Yale University Press, 2013, 341pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300162530.

Reviewed by Patricia H. Werhane, University of Virginia (Emeritus)/DePaul University


Jack Russell Weinstein's new book on Adam Smith is an interesting, challenging, but sometimes redundant narrative about Smith's theories of pluralism, rationality and education. According to Weinstein, "Smith offers a theory of pluralism that prefigures modern systems of diversity and, second . . . he presents an account of human rationality that is representative of a holistic picture of human agency." (264) These two theses, I will suggest, are controversial, at best, and require a reading of the Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS) that is unusual. What is quite worthwhile is Weinstein's analysis of Smith's theory of education and his claim that "for Smith, education improves the mental preconditions for rational thought." (195)

Weinstein begins the book with reiterating the now often-repeated arguments that there is no so-called Adam Smith Problem, the nineteenth century claim that Smith's two major works, TMS and the Wealth of Nations (WN) were written with two different purposes in mind and that, indeed, they contradict one another. The analysis and critique of the alleged Adam Smith Problem has been in the literature for some time, and Weinstein's summary does little to add to that discussion. I was also disappointed that Weinstein refers to neither Amartya Sen's On Economics and Ethics nor my book on Smith, Adam Smith's Legacy for Modern Capitalism, both of which, along with many others, cover this controversy rather thoroughly. Those authors also argue, I would suggest, that Smith is neither an egoist nor a radical 18th century individualist, two arguments Weinstein puts forth as new thinking about Smith.

However, one of Weinstein's fine contributions in the first chapters of the book is his careful and detailed comparisons of Smith to Mandeville, Shaftesbury, and Hutcheson. This is not new material, but Weinstein's comparisons are very useful to new thinking about that literature. Sadly, neither Mandeville's Fable of the Bees nor any writings of Hutcheson or Shaftesbury are mentioned in "Works Cited," despite their citations in the text. Moreover, Weinstein is not clear as to whether Smith himself adopted Shaftesbury's, Hutcheson's or Hume's theory of moral sense. My reading of Smith is that he rejected that reification of the moral sentiments although he was obviously dependent on these authors for his own thinking. Smith writes, "it is . . . absurd to call our moral faculties virtuous or vicious, morally good or evil. . . . Correct moral sentiments, on the contrary, naturally appear in some degree laudable and morally good." (TMS VII.ii.3.8, 9)

As part of this discussion, Weinstein points out that Smith, unlike Mandeville, is careful to distinguish praiseworthiness from the desire to be praised (33). This is an important distinction, particularly in any argument against a claim that Smith is some sort of egoist, although this point has been made by earlier writers on Smith as well.

Another of Weinstein's positive contributions is his extended argument that "a person's self-awareness derives from the socially constructed rational self-reflection inspired by the judgments of others." (71) This idea is often neglected in Smithian scholarship, although Charles Griswold brings up that point in his earlier book. The inexorable sociality of human beings is central to reading TMS, and to make sense of the critical role of the impartial spectator in the evolution of self-awareness and conscience.

A more controversial and indeed questionable theme in Weinstein's book is his claim that "sympathy is a rational process, cultivated by education." (68) Sympathy is a difficult notion in TMS, but it is usually traced to the notion of "fellow feeling," a process through which we identify and approve or disapprove of the moral sentiments of others. (See TMS I.i.1.1-3) Indeed, according to most readings of Smith, and following closely from his mentor Hume, human beings are motivated primarily by sentiments and only secondarily by reason. In this regard Smith writes,

But though reason is undoubtedly the source of the general rules of morality, and of all the moral judgments which we form by means of them; it is altogether absurd and unintelligible to suppose that the first perception of right and wrong can be derived from reason" (TMS VII.iii.2.7)

This is not to conclude that sentiments and reason are opposites, but rather to hold that the primary source, the first order of motivation, is sentiment. Reason is necessary for moral judgment, but judgment, too, is often partly governed by moral sentiment. Sympathy is identified with part of that process

Weinstein needs this definition of sympathy to bolster his claim that "[Smith] presents an account of human rationality that is representative of a holistic picture of human agency." But unless one buys into the identification of sympathy with rational processes, this conclusion belies Smith's preoccupation with moral sentiments, a theme that pervades almost every chapter of TMS. Perhaps I have read Smith wrongly or missed some important texts, but I find little in the way of documentation for Weinstein's conclusion.

Despite these shortcomings, one of the strengths of Adam Smith's Pluralism is its chapters on Smith's philosophy of education, a topic touched upon by many commentators but seldom carefully analyzed. Weinstein admits that Smith did not spell out explicitly his philosophy of education. Nevertheless Weinstein is able to piece together some bits from his various published and unpublished writings, some of which have been ignored by previous commentators. Smith was clearly in favor of universal education (for men!), and he saw education as a way to broaden one's thinking. But as Weinstein points out, he never imagined equal education for everyone, and thought the common people and laboring classes were either incapable or less deserving of a full education afforded to the upper cases and aristocracy. Education, according to Weinstein's reading of Smith, begins with arousing the senses and imagination as motivators of a desire to learn. (176-8) This methodology includes the arousing of sympathy, and if this is what Smith meant, then that challenges Weinstein's contention that "sympathy is a rational process, cultivated by education."

Weinstein further contends that education creates or enhances identification with community. This identification in turn, means that "education can overcome group and individual difference" (185), and "for Smith, education is the primary means through which perceived otherness is minimized; otherness here is exemplified by focusing on gender, race, and class." (83) I agree that Smith's view is that education is necessary for human beings to escape the "torpor" of repetitive work. But a careful reading of TMS, WN and even the Lectures on Jurisprudence (LJ) finds an author who is skeptical of the achievement of equality, at least of economic or gender equality. It is a real stretch of the imagination to attribute to Smith the idea that "social and political unity" can be achieved through education. Smith was much too much a Scottish aristocrat to come to such a conclusion. Moreover, as is clear in LJ, Smith had no faith in "the majority" or in democracy as being a viable form of government. (LJ 1962-3, v.126-140. See also TMS II.ii.2.1, II.i.5.10, and VI. i.1, and WN IV.ii.9.) Weinstein pushes this idea to claim that "education [is] necessary for happiness." (114 and 217) This sounds a bit like the much later writings of John Stuart Mill. Smith is very clear in the TMS that he is not a utilitarian, so one should take care in this interpretation.

Finally, no reader will fail to notice that I have not touched on Weinstein's description of Smith's alleged pluralism. While acknowledging that it is, at best, an embryonic concept in Smith's writing (24), nevertheless Weinstein claims that "Smith offers a theory of pluralism that prefigures modern systems of diversity." But that is a real stretch of Smith's analysis of class differences and the role of education. Much as it is tempting to idealize Smith, I read him as a parochially minded Scot who does the best he can to think out of that perspective. Were he around today, I dare say he would acknowledge that shortcoming. Perhaps it is the weakness of this reviewer, but I do not understand how Weinstein reaches this conclusion, and it does not do justice to other of Smith's strengths that have contributed to moral psychology and political economy.

Despite my critique, Adam Smith's Pluralism is a very clearly written book and engages the reader in thinking again about Smith and TMS in ways that others have not.