Adaptive Preferences and Women's Empowerment

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Serene J. Khader, Adaptive Preferences and Women's Empowerment, Oxford University Press, 2011, 238pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199777877.

Reviewed by Ann E. Cudd, University of Kansas


Serene Khader's book on adaptive preference is a book that should be read by anyone interested in oppression and how to struggle against and overcome it. According to many feminist theories of oppression, a primary problem for overcoming oppression is that the victims become accustomed to their circumstances and even come to prefer them. Their preference for their oppressive conditions then form practical and moral obstacles to changing them, since the oppressed act in ways to further those conditions and it seems cruel or unfair to take from the oppressed what they claim to prefer. Such preferences are called adaptive preferences, and transforming them seems to be an important goal of institutions that aim to improve the lives of the oppressed. This book is about how and why public institutions should intervene in the lives and societies of oppressed persons with adaptive preferences to encourage their flourishing. Although Khader explicitly targets impoverished and oppressed women in the global South, her arguments should apply equally to other contexts of oppression and deprivation.

In a concise and summative introductory chapter, Khader presents the outline of her argument. Her thesis is that public institutions should intervene in the lives of women with inappropriately adaptive preferences (IAPs) by means of what she terms a deliberative perfectionist approach. Using this approach will allow for intervention that does not deny the agency or autonomy of the oppressed, is culturally sensitive, and aims to achieve their deeply held desires for flourishing. This approach requires those who intervene to employ a vague, justificatorily minimal, perfectionist conception of flourishing, which is then refined and applied through deliberation by interveners with the oppressed to determine how best to change their conditions in order to improve flourishing. In order to properly determine when such intervention is necessary, Khader claims that a new conception of adaptive preference is needed. Such a conception should not impugn the autonomy of the oppressed, but should locate the problem with such preferences in their failure to lead to flourishing lives. It should treat the oppressed as agents who are making reasonable choices within the confined limits of their available options, and should avoid blaming their cultures for those limitations. Khader thus poses her view as opposed to prominent Western liberal feminist views (such as Martha Nussbaum's or Susan Okin's) that portray women as mere victims of their backward cultures.

Chapter one presents the definition of adaptive preference and sketches the details of the deliberative perfectionist approach to intervention. The term "adaptive preference" was introduced by Jon Elster, who defined adaptive preferences as preferences of the "sour grapes" structure; preferences such that, like the fox who decided the unreachable grapes were sour, the unavailability of an option causes the agent to disprefer it. Crucially for Elster, such preferences are irrational because they are formed by an unconscious process. Khader rejects Elster's view that adaptive preferences are irrational, unconscious, or the result of a downgrading of options. Rather, on her view,

adaptive preferences are (1) preferences inconsistent with basic flourishing (2) that are formed under conditions nonconducive to basic flourishing and (3) that we believe people might be persuaded to transform upon normative scrutiny of their preferences and exposure to conditions more conducive to flourishing. (42)

This definition thus highlights the harmfulness of the preferences, since they are nonconducive to basic flourishing, and the badness of the conditions under which they are formed. Khader resists saying that the bad conditions cause the preferences, however, in order to avoid suggesting that those who have such preferences are mere victims of conditions.

Given the centrality of the notion of flourishing in the definition of adaptive preferences, one might think that Khader's immediate task is to give an account of human flourishing. But she thinks we need only a very vague and minimal notion of flourishing, and what is more important is to understand how a would-be intervener could mistake perfectly reasonable preferences for IAPs and confuse unfamiliar flourishing with an absence of flourishing. Khader explains three characteristic mistakes, which I found very illuminating despite my ultimate disagreement with her characterization of adaptive preference.

The first is psychologizing the structural, which is taking people's choices to be all things considered preferences when they really just may be making the best of a bad situation. This is the familiar point that revealed preferences can only tell us how available options are ranked, not how unavailable ones would be ranked. The second is "misidentifying imposed trade-offs," which she says is treating flourishing as if it were a single vector rather than composed of disparate capacities and goods. Khader offers what I find to be an odd example: a woman who risks HIV exposure in order not to anger her husband, which is not actually a preference for unprotected sex in the face of the danger of HIV transmission or a failure to stand up for herself, but rather a rational decision to accept the risk in order not to lose her access to income and physical security. It seems to me that this physical security could easily be seen as the crucial vector of flourishing here and the woman is taking the lesser of immediate evils: die later of HIV rather than sooner from starvation or assault! The third mistake is "confusing difference with deprivation," which is simply failing to see culturally different ways of life as possible ways of flourishing. With these three mistakes clearly understood, it is possible for a would-be intervener to deliberate with the oppressed about their structural impediments to what they would consider to be a flourishing life, consistent with their cultural values.

In chapter two Khader criticizes the view that adaptive preferences represent autonomy deficits in the agent who has them. She does this by methodically arguing first that IAPs are not procedural autonomy deficits, rejecting each of three such theories of autonomy as either intuitively implausible, unsuited for development practice, or morally objectionable. Then she argues that IAPs are not substantive autonomy deficits because such a view of autonomy would recommend morally objectionable strategies for preference transformation by encouraging people to simply abandon their existing systems of value. This critique seems to me to be misguided and motivated by hypersensitivity to reasonable, though painful, cultural criticisms. The problem with the argument, a problem which also arises in the rejection of procedural views of autonomy, is that it derives a metaphysical conclusion from moral or pragmatic premises: because it is not legitimate/effective/good to recommend that people abandon (aspects of) their cultures, it cannot be the case that adaptive preferences are nonautonomous. Of course this oversimplifies the argument, but it is the basic structure. Labeling persons with IAPs nonautonomous locates the problem in the attitudes of persons with them and fails to recognize that IAPs are not simply imposed, but imposed by deprivation. But this view makes it necessary that people with adaptive preferences need external help -- they need not improve their autonomy skills and cannot improve the conditions within their community if autonomy is not the problem.

The next chapter criticizes the view that people with adaptive preferences generally fail to desire or feel entitled to enjoy what is good for them. Khader calls this the "adaptive self view of IAP," which she imputes to Nussbaum, Amartya Sen, and Anita Superson, among others. Although this view allows theorists to account for why IAPs are harmful without resorting to a perfectionist account of flourishing, Khader claims it is false because persons with IAPs do not generally fail to desire what is good for them. Rather they selectively fail to desire their own good. Seeing this is crucial to recognizing forms of resistant behavior by the oppressed which the intervener can build on to help transform IAPs. Although this point about the selectiveness of failure of self-entitlements seems to me an important point, I hardly think it has been unrecognized by the theorists to whom she has imputed the adaptive self view. She does clearly separate her view from that of Superson's over the question of whether choices can be both rational and motivated by IAPs. Khader holds that this can happen, and when it does interventions should be aimed only at changing conditions rather than changing the IAPs. But here I would question why we would want to call the preferences adaptive, rather than simply choices made under bad conditions,[1] since there is really nothing wrong with the preferences themselves, only with the choices. The distinction between choice and preference in this discussion and throughout warrants greater scrutiny.

In chapter four Khader defends her view that intervention is warranted in cases of IAP against two directions of attack: liberal views that regard preference intervention as violations of human freedom, and objections to interventions in cultural practices as imperialist and disrespectful. Khader addresses four forms of each objection. The objections from the concern for freedom reject intervention as paternalistic, coercive, disrespectful, or in violation of the harm principle. These objections are readily discharged by recommending that interveners work with the oppressed to define the aim and means of interventions through co-deliberation about flourishing, provided that persons really do prefer flourishing. But Khader admits that some do not, and these, she says, are the difficult cases for her theory. At this point it seems to me that it would be useful (and readily available to Khader's perfectionist theory) to take a structural view of the IAPs in order to see how, in reinforcing oppression, they harm others. The objections from cultural imperialism claim that interventions would impose culturally inappropriate or disrespectful values on persons, and that, contrary to Khader's perfectionist account, there is no cross-cultural account of human flourishing. She responds that her vague, minimal view of flourishing is not culturally specific and that, by deliberating respectfully with persons, common ground can be found.

Chapter five shows how to use her analysis of IAPs and deliberative perfectionist approach to empower women in ways that are conducive to flourishing. Khader claims that feminism needs to reclaim the concept of empowerment from its use as a mere rhetorical strategy for neoliberalism. Her main target here seems to be microcredit lending projects, which have been criticized for enabling women to earn a monetary income but leaving them vulnerable to predation by husbands and multinational corporations. By calling this empowerment, neoliberal development organizations are able to justify strategies that are in the interest of the developed world, but not the oppressed. Khader insists that giving persons more choices or income does not lead to empowerment, which only comes if the choices or income lead to greater flourishing. That seems clearly right to me, although the example of where earning income does not offer better options for flourishing -- the woman who is subjected to greater violence at home due to her increased earning power -- is problematic, since it holds the victim hostage to the reactions of violent others. Surely the answer here involves both increasing income and changing conditions to reduce domestic violence. As Khader has noted repeatedly, flourishing is multidimensional, and income is an essential means to achieving many dimensions of flourishing, even if not sufficient for all.

This book offers many useful insights about how to determine whether choices are due to oppressive conditions through the mechanism of adaptive preference. It also usefully explains and categorizes the variety of definitions of and objections to adaptive preferences. Khader's account of deliberative perfectionism and how it can enable respectful transformations of preferences among the oppressed is an important intervention in the literature on development ethics. The book warrants a careful read by anyone with interests in global ethics and feminist intervention.

[1] I discuss this point at length in "Oppression by Choice," Journal of Social Philosophy, 35(2005), pp. 20-49, and in Analyzing Oppression, Oxford, 2006, pp. 146-53.