Adorno and Heidegger: Philosophical Questions

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Iain Macdonald and Krzysztof Ziarek (eds.), Adorno and Heidegger: Philosophical Questions, Stanford University Press, 2008, 221pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804756365.

Reviewed by David Pettigrew, Southern Connecticut State University


This volume proposes a significant undertaking: an investigation of the relation between the philosophical thought of Adorno and Heidegger. The editors write, "there is much to be gained from working through and reassessing the differences that have kept these two thinkers' works quarantined from each other for more than seven decades" (4). The book is, without a doubt, an important contribution to the field. However, the range of articles would have benefited from a more detailed introduction indicating the contents and interrelation of the various contributions.

I will discuss the book's chapters insofar as they fall into at least one of three general groupings. A first group -- that includes four chapters -- revolves around an Adorno-Heidegger Auseinandersetzung. A second group holds Adorno and Heidegger in the background, as the authors address certain aspects of Husserl’s or Hegel’s work. A third group of chapters is organized around philosophical themes, such as "transcendental realism," "the status of the self in modernity," "the problem of remembrance," and "our relation to things". In the case of this third group, Adorno and Heidegger provide a context for thinking through the philosophical theme.

In the first group of chapters the authors adhere generally to the Adorno/Heidegger axis of the editors' design. For example, Iain Macdonald's "Ethics and Authenticity: Conscience and Non-Identity in Heidegger and Adorno, with a glance at Hegel" addresses certain aspects of Adorno's critique of Heidegger's thought, including Heidegger's alleged "archaism, his insistence on the primordiality of Being," his "ahistoricality" and his "indifference to historical contingency, suffering and adversity" (7). Macdonald presents Adorno's insistence that, among other things, "the categories of Being elaborated by Heidegger fail to do justice to historical reality"; or in other words, they do not look outward toward the "concrete inner-historical determinateness [of beings, das Seiende]" (Ibid.). For Macdonald such charges are the "real cornerstones" of Adorno's critique of Heidegger (8). Macdonald subsequently attempts to engage Adorno's critique via Heidegger's "understanding of normativity rooted in non-identity" found in the sections of Being and Time concerned with conscience and guilt (9).

In another contribution to the volume, "Truth and Authentication: Heidegger and Adorno in Reverse," Lambert Zuidervaart pits his interpretation and critique of Heidegger's account of "authenticity" against Adorno's account of "emphatic experience." Zuidervaart subsequently offers an alternative account of authentication (22). Zuidervaart takes Heidegger to task, claiming that "Heidegger's formalism leaves little room for the self's authenticity to be either constituted or tested in public" (29). Zuidervaart submits that Heidegger's self is a "nonpublic self" that "undermines the public authentication of truth" (30). While Macdonald plumbed Heidegger's themes of conscience and guilt to respond to Adorno (fashioning a kind of normativity in Being and Time), Zuidervaart "is not convinced by this attempt to rescue Heidegger" (31). Zuidervaart opines that a Heideggerian self "can neither learn from social normativity nor contribute to it." Such a self is, moreover, "fundamentally asocial and therefore also ontologically impossible" (35).

While Macdonald's and Zuidervaart's chapters are limited to Being and Time in their engagement of Heidegger's thought, two later chapters of the volume, Krzysztof Ziarek's "Beyond Critique? Art and Power," and Fred Dallmayr's "Adorno and Heidegger on Modernity," address Heidegger's texts from the 1930's, including Beiträge zur Philosophie (Vom Ereignis) (1936-38), Besinnung (1938/39), and Die Geschichte des Seyns (1938-40). More significantly, Ziarek's and Dallmayr's treatments of Heidegger shift away from the terminology of "normativity" and "self" to Heidegger's critique of Machenschaft. Ziarek writes that Heidegger thinks of Machenschaft as "machination and manipulative power, which organized reality into a state of what he calls a 'total war'" (112). Dallmayr underlines the "starkly pejorative connotations" of Heidegger's evocation of Machenschaft, with connotations or associations that include "power," "violence," "domination," "calculability" and "alienation" to name a few. These two chapters address Heidegger's work, then, as a trenchant critique of the contemporary ethos.

Ziarek writes that Adorno's assertion that "Heidegger's thought is therefore not critical at all, is obviously untrue" (111). Ziarek shows that for Heidegger art or poiesis responds to the power of Machenschaft, acting as a "freedom from power" (115). "The force of art," Ziarek suggests, "lies therefore in its ability to call into question … the very paradigm of making and producing" (Ibid.).

Dallmayr's chapter offers a concise and compelling account of Adorno's and Horkheimer's critiques of modernity. Adorno recognized "the darkly sinister undertow of Western modernity" (168) and Horkheimer "castigated the ongoing shrinkage of critical reason and self-reflection into a mere instrument of calculation and managerial control" (169). Such instrumental rationality "inevitably prepared the ground for … the homogenization of social life and thus for the establishment of increasingly effective social controls and disciplines" (171). Dallmayr's chapter provides an equally compelling association of Heidegger's critique of modernity and Machenschaft with those of Adorno and Horkheimer.

Chapters by Joanna Hodge and Nicholas Walker, in the second grouping, take a different approach. Hodge writes that with her chapter, entitled "Poietic Epistemology: Reading Husserl Through Adorno and Heidegger," she aims "to propose a re-reading of Husserl; making out a case for considering the term 'poietic epistemology' as capturing what is distinctive about Husserl's work" (67). Hodge's re-reading is carefully extricated from Heidegger's and Adorno's mis-readings of Husserl. Nicholas Walker's chapter, "Adorno and Heidegger on the Question of Art: Countering Hegel," takes Hegel as "a kind of tertium comparationis" (88). Hodge's and Walker's creative approaches offer unexpected insight into the limits of Adorno's and Heidegger's treatments of Husserl and Hegel.

A third group of chapters is organized around philosophical themes. For example, Mathew Grist writes, in his chapter "Transcendental Realism and Post-Metaphysical Thinking," that he seeks to challenge the perception "that the 'Continental' philosophical tradition has freed itself from the presuppositions of transcendental realism" (47). Grist proposes to explore the extent to which both Adorno's and Heidegger's criticism of traditional metaphysics actually "indulges in a sort of transcendental realism" (Ibid.). Grist's chapter has the virtue of reflecting comprehensively on the earlier and the later Heidegger. It is with respect to the later Heidegger that Grist finds that Heidegger's "new way of thinking" Being as Being risks a "species of transcendental realism" (55).

I question Grist's emphasis, as well as that found in Macdonald's and Zuidervaart's chapters, on the theme of "normativity" in Heidegger's thought. In Grist's case, "normativity" rests on his understanding of the distinction between "authenticity" and "inauthenticity". This is problematic since Heidegger himself states, in the "Letter on Humanism," that the terms do not imply a "moral-existentiell or an 'anthropological' distinction."[1] Further, for Heidegger, Dasein is not an anthropological self or subject. In "The Origin of the Work of Art," he states that "The resoluteness intended in Being and Time is not the deliberate action of a subject but the opening up of a human being"[2] Perhaps this is why Heidegger insists in the "Letter on Humanism" that "The tragedies of Sophocles … preserve the ethos in their sagas more primordially than Aristotle's lectures on "ethics"."[3]

Grist's engagement of Adorno is actually a critique of J.M. Bernstein's reading of Adorno. He writes that while Bernstein wants to ground our moral practices in our "'natural' affective responses to the material manifestations of suffering in others," he wants to deny that "such affectivity could ground a robust form of moral realism" (57). Grist suggests that Bernstein's treatment of Adorno implies a "cognitive re-enchantment of the world" (60). Our emphatic experience of the world, on this account, would evoke "states of affairs that are intrinsically morally compelling," and "find objects themselves normatively constraining" (61). Grist finds Bernstein's account "too one-sided," since the multiplicity of various individuals' interpretations of a given state of affairs will be "relative to a background body of beliefs" (63). This lacks any objective ground and seems to Grist to imply the "vain epistemological hopes of transcendental realism" (Ibid.).

Josef Früchtl's chapter, "The Struggle of the Self Against Itself: Adorno and Heidegger on Modernity," offers the guiding claim that "to reflect on modernity is to reflect on the self." Providing a fascinating summary of modernist visions of the self, Früchtl chooses to emphasize the "romantic discourse of modernity," according to which "modernity is the struggle of the self with and against itself" (141). While treating this conception of modernity, Früchtl's chapter provides one of the book's richest expositions of Adorno's philosophic thought. Früchtl deftly references and interweaves texts such as Minima Moralia, Dialectic of Enlightenment and Negative Dialectics. Früchtl suggests that Adorno "maintains an intermediate position here between the classical understanding of modernity as articulated by Hegel and the agonistic conception of modernity developed by the Romantic tradition" (142). Further, the struggle of the self against the self is articulated by Früchtl as one between "the social transcendental and the empirical subject," a struggle that "the latter is now unambiguously losing" (143). Früchtl writes suggestively that Adorno's work operates in a kind of "indeterminate and intermediate space between scientific research and unregulated spontaneous experience," a space that "may prompt further investigation and independent reflection" (148). Früchtl's exceptional chapter recognizes virtues in both Heidegger's and Adorno's thought with respect to the crisis of the modern self.

Mario Wennig's chapter, "Adorno, Heidegger, and the Problem of Remembrance," addresses the extent to which Adorno's and Heidegger's work involves the question of a thoughtful or critical relation to the past. For Wennig, such a relation to the past is, in some respect, a response to modernity's preoccupation with the future. Wennig writes that "Both Adorno and Heidegger argue for a turn toward historical experience. Yet Adorno's demand to work through the past and Heidegger's appropriation of thoughtful remembrance reveal important differences" (165). In his remarkable chapter, Wennig gives careful and detailed thought to Adorno's and Heidegger's respective modes of "questioning back". Wennig soberly confronts the limits intrinsic to each thinker's path.

Finally, Ute Guzzoni's chapter reflects on the relation between human beings and things in Adorno's and Heidegger's projects. Guzzoni first addresses Adorno's thinking with respect to the subject and the object. For Adorno the relation entails a recognition of difference and a "love for things" (128). The love for things "signifies rescuing what has been oppressed by the dominating subject" and is moreover a "healing, repairing, and saving attitude" (Ibid.). It is the idea of an "experience of otherness without separation or break" (129). This experience, Adorno writes, "would have its happiness in the persistence of the foreign and different within the granted nearness" (130). Guzzoni then addresses Heidegger in the context of "releasement toward things (Gelassenheit)". Such a relation could entail the openness implied by Adorno's account but Guzzoni wants to insist that for Heidegger there is "no loving relation to particular things as such" (135). For Guzzoni this is apparently the case since she writes that Heidegger's project is not to "philosophize about empirical human behavior" but to question "the mortal stay on earth" and "the fourfold of the world" (Ibid.). Nonetheless, Guzzoni fashions a thoughtful rapprochement between Adorno and Heidegger on the very basis of Heidegger's Gelassenheit:

This releasement stands in radical opposition to the calculating relation of humans to the whole of the world and to the objects that humans attempt to violently seize in a technical and scientific manner. Released thinking is neither active nor passive; it is neither the grasping of the modern subject, which attempts to get things into its grip; nor does it exercise a mere disinterested spectatorship… . it originates out of an attentive questioning and listening and a sensitive reflection. These characteristics indeed immediately remind us of Adorno's patient attentiveness and of the long, nonviolent look. (136)

The preceding citation -- from the concluding pages of Guzzoni's chapter -- is entirely emblematic of the careful and sensitive reflections offered by each of the contributors to this excellent volume as they interrogate the relation between the philosophical thought of Adorno and Heidegger.

[1] Martin Heidegger, "Letter on Humanism," in Basic Writings, trans. Frank A. Capuzzi and J. Glenn Gray (New York: HarperCollins Publishers, 1993), p. 236.

[2] Martin Heidegger, "The Origin of the Work of Art," in Basic Writings, trans. Albert Hofstadter (New York: HarperCollins Publishers, 1993), p. 192.

[3] Martin Heidegger, "Letter on Humanism," in Basic Writings, trans. Frank A. Capuzzi and J. Glenn Gray (New York: HarperCollins Publishers, 1993), p. 256.