Adorno on Nature

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Deborah Cook, Adorno on Nature, Acumen, 2011, 198pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652624

Reviewed by Eric S. Nelson, University of Massachusetts Lowell


Deborah Cook's Adorno on Nature is a welcome contribution to interpreting Theodor Adorno's philosophy of nature and its contemporary environmental import. In five chapters this book offers a comprehensive and careful analysis of the crucial and often underestimated role of nature in Adorno, tracing Adorno's conception of "natural history" (Naturgeschichte) from the 1930s to the 1960s and articulating its implications for environmental philosophy and activism. This nuanced study also critically unravels the secondary literature surrounding Adorno. It contests the tendency to construe Adorno's project as a pessimistic-utopian augury of Habermas's conception of communicative rationality or to overemphasize its non-cognitive affective and mimetic dimensions by emphasizing the significance of materialism and critical reason in Adorno's works.

"Natural history" has been a basic yet contested concept in Marxian and critical social theory since the early Marx's criticism of Feuerbach's ahistorical naturalism. On the one hand, appeals to nature appear to introduce a questionable non-historical and potentially ideological element that misconstrues the transient as permanent. Accordingly, Marx maintains in The German Ideology, Feuerbach does not recognize the social-historical mediation of the nature in which he lives and of which he speaks.[1] On this historically-oriented basis, Adorno was a persistent critic of scientistic naturalism and positivism, with their uncritical commitments to an ideological vision of nature, science, and instrumental rationality that reflect the dialectic of Enlightenment and the logic of advanced capitalist societies.

On the other hand, pure historicity appears to subvert the critique of existing society by imprisoning the social critic in one inescapable social horizon and its prejudices and denying the biological and anthropological conditions of human life that allow for the appeal to human needs and interests in defiance of -- and that would inform the critique of -- existing alienation, domination, and exploitation. It is in this context of bodily suffering and happiness that Adorno focuses on human sensuous existence, the promise of happiness intimated in animal life, and the mimetic capacities that connect humans with their environments and with animals. Cook develops her apt portrait of Adorno's "critical materialism" in relation to this dialectical and non-dual nexus of nature and history.

Cook describes in her introduction and first chapter how Adorno developed arguments in the "Idea of Natural History" (1932) that would be reconfigured throughout his life, from his joint work with Max Horkheimer, The Dialectic of Enlightenment (1944), to his late opus Negative Dialectics (1966) and the lecture-courses of the 1960s. In this chapter, Cook contrasts Adorno's use of "natural history" as a thoroughly critical materialist model with interpretations of Adorno as an anti-materialist thinker. Cook addresses this situation by examining Adorno's self-depiction of his materialism as upholding (1) the priority of nature over mind and (2) the reciprocal implication of subject and object. Adorno adopts Marx's claim that "the economic formulation of society is viewed as a process of natural history" (p.8), as Marx simultaneously advocated the priority of nature and the social-historical mystification of that nature. In Adorno's interpretation, Marx's recognition of natural history, as a transient moment of mediation that suggests what Adorno described in 1932 as a critical canon for the double interpretation of nature and history, and the historical metabolism of humans with a nature that is irreducible to spirit or mind. This places in question the "fallacy of constitutive subjectivity"; the human misinterpretation of themselves as outside of and superior to nature.

By illustrating how Adorno's position is indebted to Marx's reflections on the mutual formation and non-identity of nature and history, Cook corrects Sebastiano Timpanaro's thesis that the "pessimists" of the Frankfurt school "all have an anti-materialist, anti-Enlightenment, anti-Jacobin orientation; and all end up in, or at least tend towards, more or less explicitly religious positions" (p. 7).[2] Cook demonstrates throughout this work how Adorno's powerful criticisms of historical materialism and revolutionary politics, of Enlightenment, reason, and science, do not signal their abandonment for the sake of an obscurantist reenchantment of the world. Adorno indicated the ambiguous dialectical character of these historically mediated concepts. While their reified mystified forms serve as means of normalization and conformity, Adorno insisted against conservative and anti-modernist cultural criticism that these concepts retained their critical and transformative dimension.

In the second chapter, "Nature, red in tooth and claw," Cook clarifies Adorno's critical relation to the reductive materialism that in eliminating consciousness eliminates non-conformist consciousness and that prepares the way for the individual's actual liquidation with its theoretical elimination. In this chapter, Cook elucidates the Kantian moments in Adorno's thinking of nature. We see how Adorno employs Kant's "block" to check the powers of subsumptive identity and totality. Adorno emphasizes the limits of naturalizing and socializing the conditional subjectivity and fragile individuality of the non-identical self. Kant's critical philosophy prefigures the alterity of objects and difference of selves that cannot be reduced to a conceptual framework or historical construction. The problem with modern capitalist society is not that there are strong autonomous responsible egos who respect others as persons, but that society produces easily manipulated weak narcissistic egos fashioned by the culture-industry for anxious consumption.

The impulse toward identity and mastery is grounded in biologically based self-preservation. It is a self-preservation that has run amok and threatens and undermines the very creature it was supposed to serve. Reason, born of instincts of self-preservation, becomes the domination of the object and itself. Its instrumental control dissolves external and internal "nature" into easily processed consumable elements. Cook adroitly answers reductive critics of Adorno's materialism who maintain that nature is purely a social construct. Steven Vogel, for instance, does not recognize that both natural and social objects are mediated and that neither nature nor society is an immediate given to which the other can be reduced (p. 41). Likewise, Cook counters J. M. Bernstein's charge that Adorno is anthropomorphizing nature with the argument that non-identical is relational rather than substantive. Adorno consistently challenges the idolatry of nature, as Cook accentuates in her discussion of the problematic mystification of nature in environmental philosophy, while maintaining its non-identity and otherness. This alterity, indicated in Adorno's rereading of the sublimity of nature in Kant's Third Critique, is a check on the spell of socially dominated humanity. It intimates a rationality that does not dominate nature as an adversary out of the anxiety of self-preservation and through subsumptive identity thinking, but reflectively and mindfully listens to and is responsive to its object for its own sake. Contrary to anti-cognitivist interpretations of Adorno, this is not an affective intuitive receptivity toward the object void of conceptualization. Adopting Hegel's notion of a "freedom toward the object," concepts are required that dialectically point beyond themselves and do the object justice.[3]

The next chapter, "Thought thinking itself," is a continuation of the theme of the role of reason and the concept in Adorno's thought. Cook aptly dismantles anti-cognitivist readings of Adorno that overemphasize the affectivity of mimesis, a concept that Adorno does not deploy as much as these interpretations suppose, and underplay the mediating and liberating power of conceptualization and reflection in Adorno. Cook contrasts critical self-reflection and non-identity thinking, which are conceptual achievements that break the compulsion of identity born of mimesis and open up the concept to that which transcends it, with the conceptual fetishism of identity thinking and the pseudo-concreteness and irrational fetishizing of the non-concept. The felt, the intuited, and the lived are only indicated and come to themselves through the mediation of concepts. Adorno's project of liberating the non-conceptual dimensions of internal human nature and external nature requires the intensified critical use of concepts rather than their abandonment in the ideologically structured immediacy of life. Insofar as the sensuous, mimetic, and material core of rationality is the source of its acknowledgment of the preponderance of the object and the renewal of its creative and critical function, I would argue that Cook takes a step too far in the conceptualist direction and underemphasizes mimesis in resisting readings that overly prioritize the affective, mimetic, and passive identification with the object.

In the fourth chapter, '"Adorno's endgame," Cook challenges the tired pessimistic understanding of Adorno while recognizing his awareness of the precariousness of the contemporary situation. How can the individual -- with her conditional and fragile subjectivity, autonomy, and capacities for affectivity and critical reflection -- survive in the midst of and resist the overpowering impersonal processes of exchange, labor, and consumption in which she is enthralled? Adorno articulates how the spellbound individual remains nonetheless a point of resistance to the degradation and reification of nature and human nature in advanced capitalist societies. This individual is afflicted by the weight of the socially formed objective world and mass-reproduced social pathologies. Adorno's doubts about collective action are, however, checked by prospects for education, solidarity, and equalized exchange. The formation of the critical capacities of the individual, who is betrayed in orthodox Marxism as well as in class society, is a necessary step to check the pathologies of social life that shape movements of resistance in commodified consumerist society.

Jon Elster rejected Marx's natural history thesis, claiming that "Marx's emphasis on the extent to which nature is transformed by man is both exaggerated and pointless."[4] In the last chapter, "Adorno and radical ecology," we encounter multiple reasons for taking seriously the human control of nature and the damages humans have done to their environments and animals. The gravity and deep-rootedness of the current environmental crisis demands a different way of interacting with nature. An alternative to the capitalist domination and destruction of natural environments and animal life is disclosed in a critical materialist and socialist response. Prefiguring a thesis of social ecology and eco-feminism, Adorno's "critical materialism" reveals the interconnection between the human domination and exploitation of other humans, and the resulting inequalities of resources, opportunities, and possibilities for flourishing, and the instrumentalization and domination of nature. The damages done to nature reflect the same processes that produce damaged individual human life.

There is a radical difference between those who understand the domination of nature as at best a metaphor, since there is no "nature" and -- even if there were -- it is not capable of suffering domination, and those who maintain that a different way of experiencing nature, environments, and animals as interlinked with human life is needed.[5] In the contemporary context, Adorno's philosophy of nature presents a challenge to both the calculative instrumental pragmatism that reiterates accommodation to the existing state of affairs and mystifying holistic ontologies that dream of reenchanting the world and nostalgically returning to an abandoned identity. Neither is adequate to a crisis that is due to structurally reproduced domination and exploitation. Since individual self-transformation and purely cultural criticism are insufficient, Adorno's alternative can only be conceptualized and acted upon in confrontation with the material moment of the structural reproduction of capitalist society. Adorno's contemporary salience is not in offering an easy way out. His thought does not allow for a tranquilizing escape from the aporias of nature and history, individual personal experience and impersonal social reality, and a more responsive environmental sensibility and the restructuring and transformation of a society that subjugates life under the relentless identity of abstract exchange.

There are two additional topics that this work could have incorporated that would have been worthwhile contributions to its overall thesis. The first is the marginalization of the materialist concern for nature in the next generation of the Frankfurt School, particularly Habermas. The second is the rich and varied discourse concerning Marxist and socialist ecology that would provide a fuller context and further strategies for articulating and confronting Adorno on nature.

[1] Karl Marx, Friedrich Engels. 1972. The German Ideology. New York: International Publishers, 63.

[2] Sebastiano Timpanaro. 1975. On Materialism. London: NLB, 19.

[3] In a conversation with Horkheimer, Adorno spoke of the need of dialectically "doing the thing justice" and the dianoetic of "devoting oneself to something for its own sake and doing it justice." Theodor W. Adorno, Max Horkheimer. 2011. Towards a New Manifesto. London: Verso Books, 71, 69.

[4] Jon Elster. 1985. Making Sense of Marx. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 57.

[5] On the question of the domination of nature, and how it distinguishes Adorno from Habermas and Honneth who do not admit such domination, see Eric S. Nelson. 2011. "Revisiting the Dialectic of Environment: Nature as Ideology and Ethics in Adorno and the Frankfurt School," Telos 155: 105-126.