Adorno's Practical Philosophy: Living Less Wrongly

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Fabian Freyenhagen, Adorno's Practical Philosophy: Living Less Wrongly, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 285pp. $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107036543.

Reviewed by Espen Hammer, Temple University


Fabian Freyenhagen's book is titled Adorno's Practical Philosophy. However, the idea of extracting something like a "practical philosophy" from the writings of Theodor W. Adorno can seem problematic. Although Adorno's thinking seems animated by a passionate moral critique of central features of modernity and modern life (with Auschwitz forming its dark center), most of its more overtly moral claims are made in the form of aphorisms, comments on other thinkers (especially Kant and Hegel), and social criticism.

Freyenhagen's book successfully challenges the widespread approach to Adorno as a non-doctrinal thinker. It is a splendid and extremely lucid attempt at reconstructing an Adornian practical philosophy. Freyenhagen knows that Adorno wanted his philosophical writing to reflect a certain critical and contextual movement of thought, aspiring to be dialectical in a concrete, open sense. Yet unlike many commentators of Adorno, he does not let this deter him from identifying claims, counter-claims, justificatory strategies, and so on -- in short, translating the philosophy of Adorno into a more standard, analytic repertoire of philosophical exposition. While purists may worry about fidelity to the formal features of the text, what emerges is not only a set of highly interesting views on the nature of moral philosophy, but also a very plausible reconstruction of Adorno's views.

According to Freyenhagen, Adorno is best thought of as an epistemic and a substantive negativist about the good. Epistemic negativism is the view that we cannot know the good. For us to be able to know the good, its social conditions must be realized (or in some sense at least realizable). Since in the modern world they are not (and Freyenhagen has a lot to say about why, in Adorno's view, this is the case) realized, it follows that we cannot know the good. Substantive negativism is the view that the world in a moral sense is deeply at fault: it is "fundamentally wrong, bad, even ill and pathological" (p. 4). Ultimately, Freyenhagen finds in Adorno the claim that while we cannot know the good, we can know the bad. And to the extent that we can know the bad, we have an obligation to avoid it. At least that's the overall claim.

In a sense, this is a minimalist position -- a moral theory for troubled and dark times, what Adorno called a minima moralia (as opposed to the Aristotelian magna moralia). While very few (if any) options for attaining moral excellence emerge from it, Freyenhagen nevertheless presents an attractive and intellectually interesting position, well worth exploring.

According to the account, the modern social world is "radically evil." The term "radical evil" comes from Kant (for whom it means a standing disposition in humankind to act against duty) but is reconsidered by Adorno in terms of Auschwitz and his view that the extermination camps were not exceptions to, but rather manifestations of, a historical trend that can be traced all the way back to the dawn of humanity. As Freyenhagen correctly points out, that trend, according to Adorno, is to let considerations arising from the imperative of self-preservation trump all other claims on us. Instrumental reason -- the reasoning most directly coherent with the imperative of self-preservation -- is focused on domination: it is calculative; it treats everything as a possible means to furthering its ends; apart from the value of self-preservation, it has no conception of the objectivity of ends; and it has no sense of the dignity of the particular, its possible existence for its own sake.

In capitalism, with its incessant transformation of use value into exchange value and its demand to have every social relation viewed in terms the impersonal mechanisms of the market-place, the trend of dehumanization is not blocked but continued in new ways. While our true needs are often left unsatisfied, what Adorno called the "fully administered society" has come to dominate the individuals to the point of making them mere, as Marx put it, appendages to the machine. In so-called late capitalist societies, personal autonomy, the capacity to lead a self-directed life, has become an unrealistic ideal. Producing and consuming, we just passively respond to the options we are presented with. In a society dominated by ideology, the conceptions we have of ourselves as free are largely illusory, functions simply of following what we (to a large extent wrongly) perceive as our interests.

At this stage, a number of questions arise. Despite the well-known and deep problems of exploitation and alienation, what about the many people in industrialized nations that in fact seem to be leading lives of great opportunity and fulfillment, not only materially but in terms of exercising both privately and publicly defined autonomy? Can Adorno really be right that modern ethical life -- Hegel'sSittlichkeit, composed of various levels at which modern agents are supposed to be able to attain substantive, non-alienated freedom -- has been thoroughly destroyed by the regimes of unconstrained instrumental reason? If we accept the "radical evil" view, what happens to politics, and indeed to any meaningful human engagement? While Freyenhagen seems convinced that such an analysis remains defensible, he does not, beyond adequately presenting Adorno's now fifty- or sixty-year-old claims, do much to actually support it. He does, however, point to Adorno's sense of the limits of pure theoretic demonstration in these matters. If -- and this is why the conceptually indeterminate forms of the aphorism, artistic expression, as well as the essay were so important for Adorno -- you cannot be brought to the point of being moved or touched by the suffering involved by the "fully administered society," thereby coming to view certain phenomena in a particular light, as carrying a specific significance, perhaps with implications for how you ought to conduct your life, then theory can only bring you so far.

An important question for Freyenhagen is whether Adorno's anthropological and social critique is morally self-defeating. In his influential assessment, Jürgen Habermas, for example, argues that Adorno's premises do not allow him to account for the normativity of his own claims.[1] If Adorno is right, then reason is a mere instrument in the struggle for self-preservation and no objectively binding (moral or otherwise) claims seem possible. Moreover, if we have no way of actively shaping our lives in the light of some conception of the good, then how can we ever hope to do or be good?

Arguing that Adorno is indeed making normative claims, and that he is consistently entitled to them (without being guilty of a performative self-contradiction), Freyenhagen refuses to accept Habermas's objection. His argument defending Adorno proceeds in two steps. The first is to show that Adorno comes up with a coherent and largely successful set of criticisms against the standard options available in moral philosophy. The second is to reconstruct Adorno's positive moral philosophy.

I first turn briefly to the criticisms of traditional moral philosophy, most of which target Kant. This classical German thinker is important not just because of his great influence and ingenious arguments, but also because he supposedly reveals a number of significant tensions and antinomies besetting modern moral life. Adorno's criticisms of Kant are broadly Hegelian and familiar to most students of Kantian moral theory.

His first main point is that, while meant to honor freedom (the capacity for purely rational motivation out of respect for the moral law), Kant's divorcing of moral worth from natural inclination is purchased at the price of dominating our sensuous nature; indeed, freedom not only presupposes but is identical with inner repression. Thus, Freyenhagen concludes that, for Adorno, morality must be grounded in considerations about happiness.

Adorno's second main point is that Kant, in his refusal to compromise the unconditional rightness of the moral point of view, unduly ignores considerations about the consequences of actions. By refusing to let moral considerations communicate with the contingencies of empirical life, Kant's position risks encouraging a stance of self-righteous non-involvement. On Adorno's view, there is no absolutely right or wrong principle independently of the effects of its implementation.

The third point Adorno promotes is that the categorical imperative, due to its strict, empty universality, is unsuitable for deriving specific moral guidance in an intransparent modern world. Adequate moral judging is dependent on "thicker," more discriminatory concepts and criteria.

Finally, Adorno objects to Kant's fact of reason argument: that the authority of the moral law is a fact of human reason, something rational beings simply have to accept without justification. On Adorno's view, while it is true that our obligations are often endowed with a sense of irresistible force, this is not the result of the way reason is transcendentally structured but, rather, of socially enforced internalization of moral imperatives during our early socialization (and the punitive super-ego this process generates).

As Freyenhagen points out, no other existing moral alternatives appeal to Adorno. The utilitarian views, while mindful of consequences, too easily encourages compromise of one's ideals for the sake of bringing about some perceived larger good. It is too dependent on how the world actually works to be able to guide us towards right living in radically evil circumstances. Adorno also rejects Nietzschean creation of value (it is unrealistic that it simply can be imposed by an act of will), virtue ethics focused on character-formation and the discernment of virtue (patterns of behavior are generally too compromised and morally uncircumscribed to sustain such formation), as well as an ethics of compassion (the capacity for compassion is too unreliable and unevenly distributed to ground moral practice, and it can only mitigate injustice, not change the conditions that create and reproduce it).

Freyenhagen's discussion of these rather well-known objections is admirably clear and informative. The same is true of his reconstruction of Adorno's more positive views -- about how we may live "less wrongly." Like other interpreters, Freyenhagen begins his exposition by focusing on the so-called "new categorical imperative," introduced by Adorno in Negative Dialectics: "to arrange [one's] thoughts and actions so that Auschwitz will not repeat itself, so that nothing similar will happen."[2]

If Kant's vision of an unconditional law grounded in pure practical reason is rejected, then where does that leave Adorno in terms of showing that an imperative of this sort can have a categorical status? One important point for Freyenhagen is that the "the new categorical imperative" points to a non-deducible, non-discursive element in morality. To request a justification of this imperative seems odd and meaningless, as though the person asking for it simply did not understand what Auschwitz represents -- that Auschwitz is paradigmatic and constitutive of evil. Indeed, on this reading the relevant normativity is contained in the facts themselves. To know and understand Auschwitz and what it represented requires more than the possession of a set of descriptions and explanations: it is also to know that it was evil and to understand that this kind of evil must never again take place. Rather than being focused on maxims (subjectively adopted principles of action that may or may not pass a universalizability test), the relevant evil is disclosed to us in its immediacy. Thus, evil itself is sufficient reason to avoid it.

Although the Auschwitz case is morally uncontroversial, leaving us no less perplexed about many real moral dilemmas, Freyenhagen reconstructs this realist, objectivist view of morality with considerable finesse. Despite the well-known problem of the psychopath and the sadist, who simply cannot be brought to properly detect the salient moral facts, there is much to be said for tying adequate moral response closer to experience than what one finds in much contemporary moral theory. At the end of the book Freyenhagen argues that the conception of normativity best suited to disclose the deeper rationale in Adorno's moral thinking is broadly Aristotelian. As he admits (and I think he is right), there is little reason to believe that Adorno had such a view in mind. At best, Adorno obtained his Aristotelian intuitions from studying modern-day Aristotelians like Hegel and Marx.

That said, the key to this view, as Freyenhagen conceives of it, is the thought that each life form has a specific way of functioning that is appropriate to it. Accordingly, each member finds certain requirements to be objectively staking out what it takes to function well or flourish within that life form. If the individual lacks the capacities required for such functioning, then that will be experienced as bad. As a result, the norms prescribing morally right behavior will flow from assessments of how this life form ideally functions. They will be objective; thus, what is good and bad will be understood in terms of what it is for a particular agent to function well.

On Freyenhagen's view, an Adornian Aristotelianism would index the good to the realization of humanity while refusing to offer any positive prescriptions related to the good. The task of critical moral engagement is to avoid the bad -- that which hampers or prevents human functioning and flourishing.

Freyenhagen's Adornian account is not without challenges. One of the central premises of epistemic negativism is that knowledge of the good is made impossible by the current "wrong state of affairs." Behind this claim stands the Aristotelian and Hegelian rejection of moral abstraction: to know the good requires a sense of how the good can be, or become, real. In the "wrong state of affairs," there is nothing we can point to that unequivocally would count as good, or as having the potential to be good; thus, any proposal would either be purely abstract or too colored by the badness of things to ever qualify as offering a good alternative. In view of the many moral and political doctrines that do identify the good independently of considerations about its social reality or possible implementation, it would have been interesting to see Freyenhagen discuss this premise. Most theorists in the Platonic, Christian and natural rights traditions would certainly reject it. The same would be true of Kant, Mill, and, to a large degree, Rawls.

Readers with progressive or Marxist commitments may also question the rejection of all concrete proposals (beyond the mere negation of the bad) for how things can be improved. While Freyenhagen's Adorno does not rule out that things could be different, he does not think we are entitled to say how we can go about making that happen. Yet do we have to be that passive? It is all well and good to say that commodification can be bad; however, if that is our view, then we also seem to have an obligation to think about how an alternative system would lessen the ills associated with commodification. No one will reject your claim that environmental destruction is bad and should be resisted; however, we also need imaginative and intelligent proposals for a world in which such destruction would be lessened or eliminated. The alternative is collective self-destruction.

When taken to the extreme, as in this book, there is something potentially reactive (in the Nietzschean sense) about Adorno's overall critical vision. It requires detachment, Freyenhagen claims, from concrete engagements and a critical attitude. At best one should try to know the bad and critically resist it. Yet would one not resist the bad more effectively by attempting to formulate and realize a conception of the good? Freyenhagen's Adorno believes it would implicate you in evil. Indeed, what is the difference between this and the "beautiful soul" that Adorno detects and criticizes in Kant's moral theory?

A third question is whether there is reason to accept Adorno's view that we need to be holists about every element of the social world, thinking that it is systematically connected to all the other elements. Do we not risk flattening the moral landscape? Since Auschwitz occurred in the modern social world, Freyenhagen's Adorno avers that all modern agents are in a certain sense guilty -- there is an extended "guilt-context." Adorno also suspects that the objective conditions for Auschwitz to repeat itself continue to exist. Yet is he entitled to such a claim? Of course, complacency in these matters is not acceptable. We need, as Adorno often argues, to be perpetually on guard against indications of a relapse into barbarism. That, however, is different from thinking that nothing has changed, or that the conditions for Auschwitz were not to some degree exceptional. Freyenhagen is right to mention the Rwandan massacre and Abu Ghraib. However, it is important not to forget that Hitler's regime was resisted and eventually defeated at enormous human cost. Rather than the universal darkness of Freyenhagen's Adorno, the picture we have of key events of twentieth century history seems more complex, including not just the worst and the bad, but the good and the excellent as well.

The last question I would like to raise is whether Freyenhagen's Adorno can coherently be an Aristotelian in his practical philosophy yet resist the idea that our own life -form is incapable both of giving us knowledge of the good and of providing meaningful and attractive ways of achieving the good (which, for the Aristotelian, means good functioning or flourishing). Again, without being drawn to some sort of vision of the good, how can you even start to resist the bad? Freyenhagen tries to accommodate this concern by introducing a notion of basic functioning (which would include having food and shelter, freedom from illness and physical suffering, and the like). It is not clear, however, whether on Adorno's epistemic negativism one is entitled to such a conception. On the other hand, if one is entitled to it, then it seems at best a necessary but far from sufficient basis for articulating a morally inspiring vision of social transformation.

Although the conception Freyenhagen obtains from Adorno is faced with a number of challenges, it is no doubt a powerful one -- deeply sensitive to the historical conditions within which we find ourselves while staunchly committed to the reality of evil and our obligation to resist it. This highly stimulating book will no doubt be indispensable for future thinking about Adorno's moral and social philosophy.

[1] Jürgen Habermas, The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity: Twelve Lectures, trans. Frederick G. Lawrence (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1993), p. 119: ‘With their concept of “instrumental reason” Horkheimer and Adorno want to add up the cost incurred in the usurpation of reason’s place by a calculating intellect. This concept is simultaneously supposed to recall that when purposive rationality, overblown into a totality, abolishes the distinction between what claims validity and what is useful for self-preservation, and so tears down the barrier between validity and power, it cancels out those basic conceptual differentiations to which the modern understanding of the world believed it owed the definitive overcoming of myth. As instrumental, reason assimilated itself to power and thereby relinquished its critical force -- that is the final disclosure of ideology critique applied to itself. To be sure, this description of the self-destruction of the critical capacity is paradoxical, because in the moment of description it still has to make use of the critique that has been declared dead.’

[2] Theodor W. Adorno, Negative Dialectics, trans. E. B. Ashton (New York: Continuum, 1973), p. 365.