Aesthetic Disinterestedness: Art, Experience, and the Self

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Thomas Hilgers, Aesthetic Disinterestedness: Art, Experience, and the Self, Routledge, 2017, xv + 190pp., $ 140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138905009.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


Ever since the avant-garde movements of the early part of the twentieth century, and increasingly since the mid-1960s with its explosions of conceptual art, performance art, installation art, and video art (all against a background of social turmoil), advanced art has been predominantly political and cognitive. It has undertaken, often brutally, to tell truths about traumas, repressed subjectivities, and forms of oppression. Over the last thirty-five or so years, marked by Arthur Danto's epochal 1981 The Transfiguration of the Commonplace, in which Danto explicitly rejected aesthetic conceptions of art and challenged the aesthetic theories of Dewey and Beardsley, the philosophy of art has largely followed suit. (Noël Carroll, Nelson Goodman, and Jerrold Levinson also argued prominently against aesthetic definitions of art.) Artistic meaning and artistic truth seemed, on the whole, more central to the experience and value of art than the apparently paler blandishments of aesthetic pleasure. Disinterestedness seemed to many to be both impossible to achieve and irrelevant. Aesthetic theories of art were taken to imply formalism and a disembodied spectator, and these implications were taken as marks against them. Persistent disagreements in judgments of taste, and doubts about whether there is any significant common experience across the receptions of works in different media, posed further problems for aesthetic theories of art.

Yet there was always also an undercurrent of resistance. Richard Eldridge, Alan Goldman, Alexander Nehamas, Roger Scruton, and James Shelley, among others, and in Germany Georg Bertram, Rüdiger Bubner, and Martin Seel have all entered various plaidoyers for the aesthetic, often echoing Kant, Hegel, and Adorno, and drawing on the art criticism of Michael Fried. Paul Guyer's magisterial three volume A History of Modern Aesthetics is built around the idea that art generally has an aesthetic dimension, involving pleasure taken in form, as well as cognitive and expressive ones. To many, art has always seemed made to be enjoyed or lingered in, as well as having cognitive and expressive content, at least if it is to be more than either propaganda or gratuitiously personal expression. Thomas Hilgers's book is a distinctive and powerful contribution to an aesthetic theory of art. All art, Hilgers argues, "no matter whether it was produced during ancient, medieval, or modern times, has an aesthetic function," and in fulfilling this function it forwards "the ideals of critique and autonomy," so that it is more than merely decorative or pleasing (159).

The key to Hilgers's account of the nature and value of the aesthetic experience of art is his account of disinterestedness. "I introduce and defend a new and sophisticated account of disinterestedness, thereby also supporting a specific version of an aesthetic conception of art" (3). Many objects and experiences are aesthetically pleasing, but art is aesthetically pleasing and valuable in a specific way that is essentially disclosed through disinterested attention. It is to Hilgers's credit here that he does not introduce talk of aesthetic properties such as gracefulness, delicacy, sublimity, daintiness, dumpiness, and all their cousins. Instead, he focuses along Kantian lines on how disinterested attention is responsive to a complex interplay among a successful work's multiple formal, semantic, and expressive features. As in Dewey and Beardsley, "engagement with [an artwork] must remain an open-ended process of re-articulating and creative synthesizings . . . rather than culiminating in final conceptualizations or the construction of world-views" (3). Works of art have semantic content -- they are always "about something" (3) depictively, descriptively, expressively or thematically -- but overall content is essentially bound up with a work's specific medial and formal features and relations.

This overall content is available only to someone who attends in an appropriately disinterested way, including opening oneself to what the work asks us to do:

An artwork asks a person to engage with it in such a way that her sensuous, affective, and conceptual capacities enter a play-like state of interaction. This state affects a person in three related ways: it makes her temporarily lose her sense of herself, it makes her gain a sense of the other, and ultimately, it makes her achieve selfhood (3).

If a work fails to do this, then either the recipient is distracted by some form of personal interest or the work itself is not an artistic success or a genuine work of art: "a work of art must make us see its diegetic world, and ultimately our own world, in a unique and revealing manner" (27). To fail to do that (relative to a properly attentive, disinterested audience) is to fail to be art. A work counts as art only "because it has the power to make us have the kind of experience . . . described" (38-39).

Here it is clear that Hilgers's conception of art is, as he puts it, "normative" (9) or functional rather than flatly taxonomic or merely descriptive. That is, a work of art has a function -- drawing us into and sustaining us in the exploration of "its perspective" (84) -- that is fulfillable in various ways and to various degrees. Something put forward as a work of art does not, eo ipso, fulfill it. (Criticism is a matter of helping an audience to see which works fulfill the function of art in which ways, and in virtue of which features-in-contexts, and philosophy of art describes this function in general terms. Here the relevant philosophical descriptions will include normative terms.)

Against George Dickie, who famously argued in his 1964 "The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude" that the appropriate stance toward art is being interested in it and paying attention under the established conventions for attention that are in place for specific media of art. Hilgers argues that we must in fact do something (that the successful work asks and requires us to do) that is not settled by the fact of conventions alone: namely, abstract away from our personal interests. We must (as Alan Goldman urged) free ourselves from distractions and enter into the work's perspective on its subject matter. It is true that there are conventions for the presentation and reception of works of art in different media, as well as broader settled institutions and practices of art. But we should not forget that these conventions are in the service of an activity on the part of the recipient (engaging with the work disinterestedly) and that recipients must actively do something within the framework of the relevant conventions, institutions, and practices (pay attention in the right, disinterested way).

Any investigation that totally ignores the normative and institutional presuppositions of our relations to artworks and also ignores our ways of expressing these relations runs the risk of becoming too abstract and illusory. Any investigation, though, that ignores the intentional structure of these relations [i.e. what we do and are to do within them, in paying appropriate attention] runs the risk of missing what art is really all about, i.e. it runs the risk of not understanding the power of art (69-70).

Achieving disinterested attention requires abstracting from what Hilgers, drawing on Ernst Tugendhat, calls one's "practical identity," which is a matter of standing "in a voluntary or affective relation to [one's] life," as one takes things to matter to oneself and to motivate possible actions (8). Occupying such a stance is often largely implicit. But action in general always involves at least "implicitly and nondeliberatively affirming specific ways to exist" (106). In an extended sense, then, achieving fuller selfhood requires developing one's stance by becoming more conscious of and aptly responsive to values expressible in action. "Achieving selfhood relies on the critical reflection of one's own fundamental perspective" (113).

When appropriately attending to art, however, one must ignore normal interests or "incentive[s] to do something that [either pure or instrumental practical] reason asks one to do" in favor of a deictic, contemplative, aesthetic interest in imaginatively exploring the details of a particular work (15, 18). As Schopenhauer saw, we must "unhook," as it were, from both our normal practical stance and from the experience of an object as bound up in spatio-temporal, causal, or rational orders (44).

Contra the Humean claim that desire always motivates action, including acts of attention, it is possible to move into a stance of free attentiveness, which is a matter of adopting an available role. "There is, strictly speaking, no [distinct] aesthetic subject at all," but rather persons moving in and out of roles and aesthetic experiences, both in apt reception and in monitoring artistic production. "When having an aesthetic experience a person rather constantly dissolves and recomposes as the concrete subject she is by entering processes of alternative subjectivizations" via attending to "what [the work] shows according to its perspective" (85, 84). Normally, both in reception and in creation, one enters into "dialectics between immersion and disinterestedness, on the one hand, and confrontation on the other" as one moves into and out of the role of aesthetic recipient (135).

Hilgers emphasizes that this is a conceptual or metaphysical point. There is, he observes, a "metaphysical barrier between [for example] the diegetic world of a film and the world that [the spectator] occupies, [so that the spectator] cannot relate to what she perceives in a practical manner" (124). Similarly, one cannot take both an aesthetic interest and a sexual interest in a sculpture at the same time (136), and the experience of literature involves forgetting oneself and one's practical concerns (142). I am not entirely sure of the force of the claim about a metaphysical barrier, nor am I entirely sure that one cannot occupy two roles at the same time -- attending both practically or even concupiscently to a work while also attending aesthetically to its perspective and forms -- given that it is normal for us to alternate between roles with lightning rapidity. Documentary films such as The Thin Blue Line or The Sorrow and the Pity seem to ask for moral-practical engagement with one's world (albeit not for making or altering the work itself) via entering into their perspectives, and Rilke's famous sonnet "Archaic Torso of Apollo" ends with the injunction, seriously meant, "You must change your life." (Hilgers regards changes in commitment as possible causal consequences of the experience of art, but not as part of that experience itself.) In addition, Hilgers concedes that "invisibility [to] and practical exclusion [from the work] have cultural and institutional preconditions" (141). One is, as Danto put it, "excluded by convention" from rushing onto a stage in order to alter the action of a play (147), and in watching a film "the spectator knows, at least implicitly, that she is watching a film" (126). (These were Dickie's points about the irrelevance of disinterestedness.) Is our exclusion from the work then a matter of metaphysics, or convention, or somehow both at once? Contra Hilgers, it is perhaps better to say that it is a matter of normal practice (with a few exceptions to be noted shortly) that works of art in all media are and are to be accepted by their audiences as already completed. They present their contents as it were in the past tense -- this course of action has been described; this set of objects depicted; these forms have been presented for imaginative exploration -- and the audience cannot alter what has thus already been completely done. (Two- or three-stage performance arts such as music and theater do not normally allot a share in creation to their audiences. Artistic making can be multistage and collaborative, involving different roles, while still yielding finished works that audiences cannot alter.)

Hilgers forthrightly takes up the challenge to an aesthetic theory of art that is posed by apparently deliberately and aggressively anti-aesthetic works that require recipients' practical involvements in order to complete them, such as Maria Abramovíc's performance pieces, where Abramovíc "forced her recipients to make practical decisions about their own lives, and thereby kept them from temporarily losing their sense of self" (153). Here Hilgers challenges the "false dilemma" that either these are not genuine works of art, or his aesthetic conception of art is false, by observing that such works have "a self-reflective and self-critical moment" that is largely disinterested, and that while in the grip of such a moment, the recipients may become different practical agents than they usually are, in a way that is defined by the roles assigned by the work. These observations seem right, but they do not quite meet the sting of the charge that practical involvement is required of the recipients. Perhaps it would be better to embrace one horn of the dilemma by arguing that at the very moment that full-stop practical involvement takes place -- e.g. the audience intervenes to prevent self-mutilation -- the performance work itself comes to an end.

Importantly, Hilgers's functional account of artworks as objects of disinterested attention does not reduce art to a matter of idle enjoyment. Hilgers notes that his views were inspired by Stanley Cavell's remark in The World Viewed that "apart from the wish for selfhood (hence the always simultaneous granting of otherness as well), I do not understand the value of art" (cited 10n5). The idea is that when we enter imaginatively into how a work asks us to see things -- complexes of objects, events, actions, and people -- as mattering, productively or horrifically, to and for human agents, then our own senses of how and why things matter can be aptly altered. The implication here is that we often enough suffer from cliché and inattentiveness, and that art's heightening of attention -- its animation of our sensibilities -- can address this condition effectively. Here, oddly, in his wish to avoid formalism, Hilgers does not say as much as he might about how and why we might come to trust a work's perspective. This must, I think, have to do with the pleasure we take in its avoidance of cliché, crossed with its presentation of possibilities of human life that are relevant to and for us as thematized by the work and presented under emotional colorings. When the work unfolds well in our attending to it, then we find (in Wordsworth's terms) that our "understanding [is] . . . in some degree enlightened, and [our] affections strengthened and purified."[1] It would have been good to hear more about exactly how this enlightenment, strengthening, and purification take place via the experience of a trustworthy work, beyond the fact of simply entering into its new perspective -- good to hear more about what makes its perspective worth our trust.

Nonetheless, Hilgers has worked out many of the details of a generally Kantian aesthetic theory of art and its value as fully as anyone, and his study significantly advances the discussion both of what art is and how and why it matters to us.

[1] William Wordsworth, “Preface to Lyrical Ballads,” in Wordsworth, Selected Poems and Prefaces, ed. Jack Stillinger (Boston: Houghton Mifflin, 1965), p. 448.