Aesthetics and Cognition in Kant's Critical Philosophy

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Rebecca Kukla (ed.), Aesthetics and Cognition in Kant's Critical Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 309pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521862019.

Reviewed by Katalin Makkai, Barnard College, Columbia University


Aesthetics and Cognition in Kant's Critical Philosophy is a valuable collection of eleven new essays, including a substantive introduction. Its contributors explore two distinguishable sets of questions, each linked to a particular Kantian sense of "aesthetic" and each the subject of rich recent and ongoing work, much of it by the contributors to this volume. The first set of questions starts from Kant's division of cognition into its sensible and discursive dimensions, the (transcendental) "doctrine" of the former constituting the (transcendental) "aesthetic" of the Critique of Pure Reason. How are we to think of the contributions of sensibility, this pre- or non-discursive dimension of cognition? What role does it play in our acquisition of empirical concepts, and with respect to making possible the objectivity -- the responsiveness to an independent reality -- of our applications of those concepts to the world? The second set of questions centers around Kant's account of aesthetic judgment, the pure judgment of beauty in particular. Although Kant insists that the judgment of beauty is distinct from cognition precisely insofar as it is aesthetic, his elaborations of its conditions repeatedly highlight what they share. Furthermore, Kant casts his investigation of the judgment of beauty as part of a larger discussion of reflective judgment that is supposedly needed to complete the picture of cognition (determinative judgment) that is disclosed from the perspective of the first Critique. Do Kant's accounts of aesthetic judgment in the third Critique and of cognition in the first really illuminate each other? If so, how?

Some readers of Kant (including several of the contributors to this volume) explore the intersections of these strands of inquiry, but the essays here tend to focus on one or the other. One of the main achievements of Kukla's introduction is to weave them together into a suggestive narrative regarding the development of Kant's thought. Kukla proposes that from the first Critique through the third, and beginning with the first Critique's surprising introduction of the notion of the synthesis of the imagination, Kant's work can be seen as granting increasingly greater autonomy and activity to the sensible faculty of the mind. The essays that follow the introduction are divided into three parts. Those of Part I consider the Kantian conditions of cognition, highlighting the sensible faculties of intuition and imagination. Part II studies the judgment of beauty in the light of the first Critique's account of cognition. Part III consists of essays that think about how Kant's picture of reflective judgment (plus other aspects of his aesthetic theory) forms a necessary expansion of -- or, alternatively, a fundamental challenge to -- his epistemology. In this space I cannot discuss all of the essays; in addition to those mentioned below are essays by Mark Okrent (Part I), Melissa Zinkin (Part II), and John McCumber (Part III).

Hannah Ginsborg's essay, which opens Part I, argues that Kant provides a distinctive solution to the familiar problem of accounting for our acquisition of inherently general (or "universal") empirical concepts without presupposing the very recognitional capacities in question. Kant's solution, Ginsborg claims, can be understood in terms of a "normative twist" (49) on a Humean approach. Relying on the presumed fact that (for example) "once the word 'triangle' has been applied to a representative sample of triangles, we will become disposed to apply it to triangles generally" (45-6), Ginsborg's Hume identifies the acquisition of such a disposition with the possession of the concept "triangle". According to Ginsborg, Kant retains the idea of its being a basic psychological fact about us that we have natural tendencies to associate in limited patterns. He emends the Humean story by widening its scope to cover perception generally and, most crucially, by correcting a shortcoming: for what is missing is an explanation of how our representations come to have generality as part of their content. Consequently, for Kant, my perception of a tree involves my being disposed to reproduce representations of other trees and my taking this tendency to be appropriate, or universally valid.

It might seem that this solution does not escape circularity, for isn't taking my tendency to be universally valid a matter of taking it to conform to a norm or rule? Ginsborg's reply hinges on the idea of a different, "primitive", way of ascribing universal validity: rather than taking my associations to follow a given rule, I take them to exemplify (constitute) a rule in the first place. (Kant's notion of aesthetic judgment, Ginsborg claims, likewise involves a claim to exemplary universality.) But there is a related worry that Ginsborg does not address. In order for such a state to count as the perception of a tree (the representation of it as a tree), it is necessary that the tendency that I regard as universal in this "primitive" sense be that of reproducing ideas of trees (and not, say, of things to be found in a forest). Not merely must I have the appropriate tendency -- the one that picks out trees -- but it is that tendency that I must take to be appropriate. Then the threat of circularity appears to return. (The point is not that I must "have in mind the idea of a specific rule or standard" (55), but rather that what I must regard as appropriate is the appropriate tendency.)

Richard Manning's essay looks at a dilemma produced by Kant's division of the cognitive faculties into a receptive component (sensibility) and an active component (understanding and imagination). "Sheer presynthesized sensibility is too unstructured, as Kant seems to conceive it" (66) to guide the operations of activity which yield judgment. Consequently, intuition seems to be unable to perform one of its functions, that of assuring the answerability of judgment to the way things are. The "unified account" developed by John McDowell denies that Kantian cognition contains, or needs, a moment of sheer sensibility. The contributions of sensibility are "always already conceptually structured" (71), and hence are suited to satisfy the requirement of answerability to the world. The heart of Manning's essay is the claim that the unified account fails to adequately address the charge of collapsing into idealism. What makes Manning's critique incomplete, I think, is his characterization of McDowell's response to the threat of idealism. Citing McDowell's remark that "[m]ere synthesis just happens; it is not our doing, unlike making judgments, deciding what to think about something" (1998: 462), Manning takes McDowell to rest his response to the threat of idealism on the passive, or uncontrolled, character of perception. But McDowell makes this remark in the context of explaining how to construe passages in Kant -- such as his speaking of "the mere synthesis of various representations in an intuition" (A79/B104-5) -- which are troublesome for a unified account insofar as they seem to deny the conceptual permeation of intuition. Thus McDowell says that "these remarks of Kant's are perfectly intelligible on the different reading I am giving. The point is simply that it does not take cognitive work for objects to come into view for us" (1998: 462). This might not be satisfying as a reading of Kant, or as a way of contrasting perception and judgment (as Manning rightly and helpfully points out), but it should not be faulted for failing to disarm the threat of idealism, since that is not its aim. What is needed is a discussion of McDowell's effort to trace the looming sense of idealism back to a prejudicial "scientism" (1998: 489).

The first piece in Part II is a critique by Paul Guyer of Henry Allison's Kant's Theory of Taste, followed by a reply by Allison. The exchange identifies some of the deepest points of conflict between their philosophical and interpretive approaches to Kant's aesthetics. Leaving aside their discussion of the connections between aesthetics and morality, I focus on Guyer's two central objections.

According to Guyer, Allison's account is committed to a thesis there is no reason to attribute to Kant, namely, that the feeling of pleasure in beauty is phenomenologically distinguishable from other feelings. Guyer's reasoning appears to be that it is only by way of such a thesis that sense can be made of the thought that the judgment of taste is made by, or through, feeling -- a better way of putting what Guyer calls Allison's "suggestion that feeling can be equated with the capacity to judge" (116). But the alternative that Guyer has left out is Allison's own guiding idea that the feeling of pleasure which grounds the judgment of beauty has intentional content: it is a mode of awareness of the state of harmonious free play of one's cognitive faculties. Perhaps Guyer has left this alternative unmentioned because, as he now goes on to say, he finds it to be "undeveloped and unsustained" (118). In the course of elaborating this charge, Guyer points out that the idea of the judgment of beauty's feeling of pleasure as the means through which one becomes aware of the free play can be accommodated within a causal framework, as (for example) a mushroom cloud can be a means through which one becomes aware of its cause (a volcanic eruption) when competing potential causes (e.g., a nuclear bomb) are ruled out. But Allison's case for rejecting the causal account is not based on denying this possibility; it rests, rather, on the thought that the causal reading casts the judgment of beauty as an empirical cognitive judgment, which, according to Allison, directly contradicts Kant's key claim that the judgment of beauty is aesthetic and not cognitive.

Guyer criticizes Allison's reading of the deduction of pure judgments of beauty on the grounds that it does not address the problem raised in Guyer's Kant and the Claims of Taste, namely that Kant fails to establish that everyone will respond to the same objects with the harmonious free play of the faculties. But (as Allison points out) this problem arises only in the context of Guyer's causal reading, with its construal of the claim to universal validity as a prediction of agreement. On Allison's intentional reading, by contrast, what the deduction must underwrite is the judgment of taste's demand for universal agreement, and it accomplishes this by showing that an object that merits the response of free play from one person merits it from all. What emerges in this part of the exchange is the essential difference between their conceptions of beauty as subjective purposiveness. I would put it this way: for Guyer, an object is subjectively purposive insofar as it causes the free play in (normal) human beings (in the appropriate conditions); for Allison, an object is subjectively purposive insofar as the free play is the appropriate response to it.

One claim fairly near the end of Allison's piece is puzzling, I find. Granting that, for Kant, one can never be sure that the grounds of one's liking are indeed an object's beauty (and not some "private" grounds), Allison concludes that "one is never in a position actually to demand the agreement of others to a particular judgment": "(W)hat you must agree with is not my first-order judgment that x is beautiful … [but] rather the normative principle that if my liking for an object is, in fact, based on these grounds, you ought to like it also" (134). But Kant's claim is that the judgment of beauty demands agreement with its judgment (and with its pleasure in particular), not with a second-order principle, and the unavoidability of uncertainty does not require us to revise his claim. Instead of this proposal -- whereby since I am never in a position to know that my judgment is properly grounded, all that I ever demand is your agreement that if my judgment is properly grounded then you ought to share it -- the following seems to me preferable, and, moreover, more faithful to Allison's own account in Kant's Theory of Taste: Although I can never know that my judgment is properly grounded, if it is then my demand for agreement is licensed, which is to say that you ought to agree with my judgment.

This second part of the collection includes another contribution of Guyer's, an essay that returns to the notorious problem of working out Kant's notion of the harmonious free play of the imagination and understanding in the judging of beauty. According to Guyer, interpretations developed thus far fall under two categories. The "precognitive" approach takes the free play to consist in "a state of mind that satisfies all the conditions for cognition except the final condition that would transform it into actual cognition" (165). On the "multicognitive" approach, in free play the mind "flit[s] back and forth playfully and enjoyably among different ways of conceiving the same object" without settling on any one in particular. I am not sure that these characterizations fit all of their intended targets. For example, Guyer says that Ginsborg casts "aesthetic experience as a precognitive state" (168), but on her view the free play of aesthetic experience "does not take place in … any act of cognition" (1997: 74); cognition does not consist of it plus something more. Guyer's own view in his Kant and the Claims of Taste counts as "precognitive", but he now advocates the "metacognitive" alternative, on which to experience free play is to find that the manifold of intuition possesses a kind of unity that "goes beyond whatever is necessary for ordinary cognition" (183). In the end, Guyer does not discard the precognitive and multicognitive approaches, however, but rather relocates them within the metacognitivist approach. Thus they identify particular ways in which we can experience the unity of a manifold to transcend the conditions of cognition.

On Allison's reading, the response to beauty involves a feeling of unity that transcends conceptualization (he speaks of "a certain organization or coherence in what is imaginatively reproduced (in the apprehension of the manifold)" (2001: 170)), and yet Guyer counts him among the multicognitivists. What, exactly, is the difference between (for example) a multicognitive view and a metacognitive view that specifies the felt unity in multicognitive terms? It must, I think, have to do with whether the sense of a cognition-transcending unity is part of the free play itself or, instead, is external to the free play proper and arises only at the "meta" level of some attitude taken towards the free play -- whether or not, in short, the free play "thinks" of itself as apprehending a kind of unity.

One of the most interesting of Guyer's arguments for the metacognitive account is that it registers a feature that is internal to the very idea of the free play, namely that it cannot be specified in one particular overarching way. This, I think, is more promising ground than that on which Guyer levies his main objection against both the precognitive and the multicognitive views, the point that in an aesthetic judgment (for Kant and more generally) one individuates the object by way of a concept: "This F is beautiful". For the interpreters that Guyer mentions do not deny this, and in any case it is unclear why a precognitive or multicognitive view would have to deny it. What bars either from granting that the individuation of an object involves bringing it under a concept, while the experience (judging) of its beauty does not? Guyer appears to move from the point that concepts are needed for individuation to the conclusion that the state of free play itself cannot be understood as lacking determining concepts, but it is not clear how this shift is warranted.

Many interpreters have found Kant's division of the Analytic of the Beautiful according to the moments of judgment identified in the first Critique to be artificial. Against this tendency, Béatrice Longuenesse's essay makes the case that this division does indeed serve its purpose of unfolding the character of the judgment of beauty. Construing Kant's judgment of beauty as involving an explicit judgment about the object together with an implicit judgment about us judging subjects, Longuenesse proposes that Kant be read as identifying two levels of pleasure in beauty. I experience a first-order pleasure in the mutually enlivening free play of the cognitive faculties. Furthermore, I experience a second-order pleasure based on the sense that the pleasurable free play is universally communicable ("could and ought to be shared by all" (207)). Arguing that Kant's models of cognitive and of moral normativity -- the claim to truth that characterizes cognitive judgment, and the imperative that flows from the moral law -- are both relevant to explicating the judgment of beauty's normative dimension, Longuenesse presents this dimension in terms of an obligation of each human being to take her part "in the common effort to constitute humanity as a community of judging subjects" (219).

The two essays that I mention from Part III both respond to Longuenesse's project in Kant and the Capacity to Judge, where she traces the "reflective" role of judgment in concept formation and application. Rudolf Makkreel begins by arguing, contra Longuenesse, that the third Critique's notion of reflective judgment is to be distinguished from the kind of logical reflection that is necessary for the formation of empirical concepts. This means that (pace Longuenesse) we should not think of it as a moment or dimension of determinative judgment. In the remainder of his essay, Makkreel develops the notion of reflective judgment that is, in his view, distinctive to the third Critique. For Makkreel, reflective judgment is "orientational and interpretive" and "frames our experience" (244).

Kirk Pillow, by contrast, is sympathetic to Longuenesse's bringing together the third Critique's notion of reflective judgment with the first Critique's picture of determinative cognition. The trouble with Longuenesse's reading, according to Pillow, is that it nevertheless sharply distinguishes between aesthetic ("merely reflective") judgment and the kind of reflection that figures as a dimension of determinative cognition. It is the resulting appearance of the irrelevance of aesthetic judgment to cognition that Pillow wishes to correct. In this effort, Pillow is going beyond the comparatively modest unifying aims of Kant's "efforts to place distinct aesthetic and cognitive experiences into an architectonic whole" (264). For Pillow seeks nothing less than an account of "understanding aestheticized" (the title of his piece). Against Kant's own "impoverished conception of cognition" (246), Pillow draws on the work of Nelson Goodman and Catherine Elgin in order to sketch the alternative he favors, on which cognition itself involves aesthetic capacities. The resulting account of understanding is coherentist and interpretive, privileging the cognitive value of "rightness of fit" over that of truth (258).

But Pillow doesn't simply contrast this picture with Kant's. For he says that some of its components may be found within Kant's aesthetic theory. Thus, "Kant's conception of the aesthetic idea is the exemplar in his thought of this kind of understanding" (252), the "aestheticized" kind; and the normativity of aestheticized understanding "is embodied in the sensus communis of the fourth moment of Kant's Analytic" (259) -- as long as Kant's idea of a transcendental foundation for such a common sense is abandoned and his unqualified notion of universality replaced by a relativized version. It remains somewhat unclear what claims are being made for the contribution of Kant's critical aesthetics to the aestheticized account of understanding. Is the thought that we need to learn from Kant's aesthetic theory in order to work out such an account? But in fact Pillow succeeds in sketching the account more or less independently before turning to the juxtaposition with Kant's aesthetics. So we might find that what he shows is how, given the account of an aestheticized understanding, elements of Kant's aesthetics can -- when suitably adapted -- be recast in its light as corresponding to parts of that account. Occasionally Pillow puts his larger point this way: with his insistence on a univocal notion of reflective judgment of which aesthetic judgment is one aspect, Kant anticipates, or in some sense prepares the way for, a conception of aestheticized understanding. But the force of such a claim is difficult to assess, given the distance (which Pillow himself emphasizes) between aestheticized understanding and Kant's official picture of understanding, and given the need to ignore aspects of Kant's aesthetic theory (in addition to Kant's stake in transcendental grounding, there is, for instance, his emphasis on pleasure) in aligning it with the former.


Allison, H. (2001), Kant's Theory of Taste, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

McDowell, J. (1998), "Having the World in View: Kant, Sellars, and Intentionality", Journal of Philosophy 95: 431-491.

Ginsborg, H (1997), "Lawfulness without a Law", Philosophical Topics 25: 37-81.