Aesthetics and the Work of Art: Adorno, Kafka, Richter

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Peter de Bolla and Stefan H. Uhlig (eds.), Aesthetics and the Work of Art: Adorno, Kafka, Richter, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 247pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780333714829.

Reviewed by Michael Kelly, University of North Carolina at Charlotte


Readers of Peter de Bolla and Stefan H. Uhlig's collection, Aesthetics and the Work of Art: Adorno, Kafka, Richter, might initially wonder how such a significant problem in aesthetics could possibly be treated properly by relying on only one philosopher, albeit one who makes this problem a central theme in his writings. They may also wonder why only two artists are discussed, and even more why only two works by them are represented: Kafka's story, "A Report to an Academy," and Richter's painting, Betty -- both reproduced in this volume along with the "Draft Introduction" to Adorno's Aesthetic Theory. In the end, while pursuing diverse strategies for negotiating the "troubled interfaces" between aesthetics and the work of art, the authors (from comparative literature, cultural history, art theory, and philosophy) validate the choice of Adorno, Kafka, and Richter, though especially the latter two because it is clear that works of art are in the lead here, as Adorno would have them be. So this is an excellent, impassioned collection on a vital topic by a variety of authors who make powerful cases, from multiple perspectives, about how we might best practice aesthetics today.

Why are there so many barriers rather than membranes between aesthetics and art? Conceptually, there seems to be a tension instead of a "happy conjunction" between them, starting with an apparent circularity, since we seemingly cannot speak of an art work without having a concept of art in mind, yet that very concept cannot be imagined until we have concrete works. We might respond to this conceptual problem, as the editors do, by rejecting the prevalent ontology of art practiced by analytic aestheticians, who define art and then understand artworks as instantiations of that definition, and by focusing instead on the phenomenology of our affective experiences of singular works of art without naively privileging the artwork over theory. But then we have to contend with history, where the relationship between aesthetics and the work of art is equally problematic, since aesthetics predates the concept of the work of art and then, when the two are in place, aesthetics and the work seem to cooperate for only brief periods (e.g., in the early 19th century). Today, contemporary art appears to be independent of aesthetics and, in turn, aesthetics is concerned with much more than art, now that everyday experience and social-political concerns are routinely critiqued through aesthetics.

Seen in such conceptual and historical light, a productive relationship between aesthetics and the work of art seems nigh impossible and, worse, both art and aesthetics seem precarious. But this is decidedly not the view espoused in the ten essays in this collection, starting with Simon Jarvis's "What Does Art Know?" While I agree with much of his clear discussion of the continued relevance of Adorno, I find the claim that "Works of art know something we do not" to be a puzzling personification of artworks in order to make a case that they are "cognitive artifacts." I agree that the use of artistic techniques is a way of thinking, and I understand why Jarvis does not want to say that artists are autonomously doing the thinking in art because, among other things, that would render art (and aesthetics) too subjective. But he seems to overstate his case. For example, he argues that "individual men and women make art, but not in circumstances of their own choosing" (66). However, after arguing against the autonomy of the artist, he then argues for the autonomy of artistic materials that "think back" since they embody "practices, habits, traditions." So autonomy reappears. To take a second example of its reappearance, Jarvis argues that "the thinking that happens in a poem" is "not all the poet's own work" (69). But even if we should not interpret a poem in terms of the poet's intentions, at least not if they are understood in purely subjective terms, that does not imply that poetry does the thinking instead of a poet. To account for what determines any thinking that is taking place in poetry beyond such intentions, do we really need to say that the poem is the agent? After all, isn't the point of Jarvis's own materialism to account for poetic thinking by looking outside the poem to, say, what the poet "cares" about?

The haunting, reappearing concept of autonomy is critiqued in Timothy J. Reiss's "Aesthetics and the Fully Emancipated Subject: Cultures, Histories and the Fictive Imagination." He starts from Adorno's account of the reflexive subject as the ground of autonomous aesthetic experience (71), but argues against it that this account makes aesthetics a historically specific field localized to Western art. So autonomy is thereby historicized, even to the point that it does violence to non-Western societies when it is used, instrumentally (73, 85), to understand their "art" in terms of a normative ideal of autonomy they do not recognize. For example, if aesthetics is supposed to bridge the Enlightenment divide between reason and emotion, it has no positive role in a society that is not "infused with a sense of [such] divisions" (80). So aesthetics and art are historically particular: "It is not that aesthetics has no place," as some advocates of the anti-aesthetic stance argue, "It is that it has a precise one" (88). But isn't this just what Adorno argues when he says, as Reiss acknowledges, that art is autonomous and a fait social, that is, that the sociality of art conditions its autonomy and, in so doing, localizes it? What Reiss adds to this argument is a concrete analysis of how it might be possible to understand another culture -- e.g., the Gikuyu concept and practice of kirira -- that is not normatively committed to "universalist axioms" underlying the conceptual constellation known as autonomy (77).

Julian Roberts adds to Reiss's analysis, in effect, by critiquing Adorno's metaphysics while favoring his "analysis of the role of history in art and criticism" (92). Roberts's focus is the "undeniable" claim "that art has a semantic force going far beyond museums, consumerism and the art market," contrary to some critical theorists who believe such force is no longer possible (101). At the same time, there is a corresponding need for aesthetics "to unlock and amplify" this force and to demonstrate the link between "art and the impulse to a better history" (101). However, despite these claims for a historicized aesthetics, as well as Roberts's positive reference to the Scottish Enlightenment figures because they argued that "artistic, moral and political sensibilities were all of a piece" (92), even he agrees that Adorno is "right to emphasize that aesthetic criticism must concentrate on what is truly 'aesthetic'" (102). So it seems that the ghost of autonomy is still alive.

At this point, the discussion shifts from Adorno to Kafka, specifically "A Report to an Academy," which means the theoretical priority given to the work over theory is put into practice or, better, put to the test. Kafka is clearly a challenging choice, given Adorno's claim in "Notes on Kafka" that his prose resists interpretation, whether as parable or allegory, yet such resistance cannot be raised to an interpretive guide and even less to a theoretical principle. Miguel Tamen responds in his "The Ape Speaks" by arguing, by analogy, that "a talking ape giving a false report is a good definition of 'artist'" (113). Because talking apes are not real apes and thus the report from the Kafka-ape cannot be a report, the ape cannot fulfill his assignment to submit a report to the academy on his previous life as an ape. Likewise, artists cannot fulfill their task either, however it is characterized, because they too traffic in the equivalent of unreal or false reports.

According to Tamen, the ape cannot succeed for at least three reasons: (1) because it has been five long years since he left apedom, (2) because he did not obstinately cling to the apedom on which he was now being asked to report, and (3) because human words can only sketch feelings experienced in apedom. But there are several problems with these reasons which, in turn, reveal why Tamen's analogy between the ape and the artist fails to get off the ground. First, he misconstrues the second reason by calling it empirical. The ape's accomplishments in the human world would have been impossible had he clung to his apedom, so distance from his origin was a necessary, not merely empirical, condition of his accomplishments. Second, regarding the third reason, while it may be true that human words can only sketch apish feelings, such a point in the present context (where the emphasis is on concretion over metaphysics) should be only about the human-ape disconnect, not "a general claim about language and truth" (118). Third, as Tamen acknowledges, the ape adds that "there can be no doubt" that his language "leans" in the direction of "the old apish truth" (107), though in doing so he reconfirms the temporal distance between his feelings "of the time" when he was an ape and his words when he is issuing his report. Fourth, the ape claims to be reporting only on his "one feeling: no way out" and he does so with great success, realizing that his life depends on it: "I had no way out but had to provide myself with one, for I could not live without it" (107). Moreover, once he thought of a "way out," which we learn later is a mimetic skill that allows him to join the vaudeville (instead of the zoo) as an ape aping a human, he "stopped being an ape" (107). So the ape is able to do more with human words than merely sketch an apish feeling since he is referring to a feeling that, when carried out into the human world, led to the acquisition of language. In short, Kafka's ape is more successful than Tamen allows and, continuing with his own analogy, so too is any artist.

To be sure, even the ape realizes that his success is not the fulfillment of a promise: "Promises of that kind, for seemingly impossible fulfillment, are not given. But if fulfillment is achieved," as the very fact of the ape's even attempting a report demonstrates, "the promises also appear subsequently, just where they had earlier been sought in vain" (109). In this light, it seems that Tamen focuses only on the seeming impossibility of the ape's odyssey when it commences (or when he's telling his story) and overlooks the fulfillment the ape achieves in the end, his "way out," which is the truth-content of his story. Granted, the ape acknowledges that he behaves as if he had calculated his "way out" when in reality it was beyond his control, but he adds dialectically that in saying this he is behaving and speaking "under the influence" of his human environment (109), the very one to which his report is directed. In true Adornian fashion, the Kafka-ape mimics the semblance of autonomy and in this sense is indeed an artist, though not quite the one Tamen imagines.

Stanley Corngold in his "Kafka's 'A Report to an Academy' with Adorno," similarly compares Kafka's story and the ontological condition of art. What links them is the "pure mimetic impulse," for it is both the reason for the ape's success, however qualified it is, and the "motor of artistic composition" that enables the artist to succeed, again with whatever constraints are attached. In developing this link, Corngold reads Kafka's story through the lens of Adorno's Aesthetic Theory. Though an instructive exercise, since there are clear parallels between the two texts, this approach does not seem to me to advance the purpose of the collection, namely, to let the work of art guide the development of aesthetic theory (if Corngold's aim is to take issue with his fellow contributors on this score, he doesn't do so explicitly). He is a Kafka scholar, so he could have easily pursued the work-first approach and to some extent he does, despite his stated intention. Yet, even if this issue were resolved, there is some unclarity, at least for me, about whether Corngold's comparison of the two texts involves the relationship between the ape and the philosopher (149), Kafka's story and philosophical aesthetics (152), or the ape and the work of art (154), since all options are mentioned. Given this shifting focus, I sometimes found it hard to appreciate fully the point of the comparisons.

In "Kafka's Exit: Exile, Exodus and Messianism," Howard Caygill traces the theme of the "way out" through many of Kafka's writings before arguing that the ape in "A Report to an Academy" chooses exile in the human world rather than even attempt to return to apedom. This is why he sharply and repeatedly distinguishes the way out from freedom, for the latter meant escaping his cage and then either being attacked by a snake, recaptured, and confined to a more restrictive cage or jumping overboard and almost certainly drowning. The ape makes his choice, a way out or exodus, only after he is exiled from Africa to Europe, so the choice is severely constrained (unfree). But here, again, the ape behaves as if he had calculated his way out, since he did choose not to expire in the cage, not to try to return to his origin, not to go to a zoo. At the same time, he did choose to be calm and survive, to go forward, and to go to vaudeville where he becomes an artist. So once again, the analogy between the ape's fate and the artist's fate comes to the fore. But Caygill's account is constructive because now the artist is faced with a difficult but not impossible task. In renouncing hope (for any return to his origin) and replacing it with calm (that enables him to go forward), the ape "performs the evacuation of the messianic" that allows him to say in the end: "By and large, I have achieved what I wanted to achieve. Let no one say that it hasn't been worth it" (112). The ape's success, like the artist's, does not depend on the truth (or falsity) of his report about his origin since his story is a human-language account of an ape's success in following the mimetic impulse.

The discussion of the relationship between a work of art and aesthetics shifts again when the contributors begin analyzing Richter's painting called Betty. Anthony Cascardi's "The Matter of Memory: On Semblance and History in Richter and Adorno" is an excellent account of the "through lines" or issues (memory, time, trauma) embodied in Richter's very diverse work (abstract and figurative painting, photography, sculpture, etc.), which also provide the proper background for looking at Betty. First of all, this painting of Richter's daughter was completed in the same year he painted his 18 Oktober 1977 series, a group of fifteen paintings dealing with the Baader-Meinhof urban terrorist group active in Germany from the late 1960s until the early 1990s. So a seemingly personal work is intertwined with a historical series, Cascardi argues, to the point that "it is indeed history that is being presented" in Betty (180). Second, Richter's trademark blurring technique is a way "to demonstrate that between us and history stands something other than representation," namely, "a past which," like the Kafka-ape's origin, "cannot adequately be recalled" (181) for reasons similar to those cited earlier. Third, the inadequacy of memory, too often discussed as a failing of art, is rather the result of the difficulty of witnessing because of "an unassimilated remainder that cannot be fully captured by thought" (182). According to Cascardi, Richter uses the blurring technique to "enact" this difficulty, though in Betty the enactment is carried out more through the posturing of the figure, by the way Betty seems to turn away from the painter and viewer. Her refusal to be seen is the refusal of witnessing, so a refusal to be witnessed takes the form of a refusal to be seen. Fourth, while the blurring or posturing techniques do not re-present a past event, they do allow for its delayed appearance, much the way a traumatic event returns as something that resists telling/seeing even as it is told/seen. The concept of delay thereby points to an uncanny mixture of an ability to recover the past and an inability to have access to it, a testimony of a past event, after all, despite the impossibility of its direct access (183-84). Finally, in concluding, Cascardi sharpens the contrasts between Adorno and Richter by claiming that while "artworks sustain a utopian ambition" for Adorno, "Richter shows that the semblance quality of art is hardly utopian at all … because it is so deeply involved in fathoming the relationship between the present and the past" (184). But I'm not sure there is a real contrast here, because fathoming the past/present relationship on the model of trauma or suffering seems to be precisely the utopian moment in Adorno. For when the traumatic past "to which nobody could attest" "nonetheless returns to be seen" in art (185), the future does indeed have a material form.

The issue of Betty's posture, her turning away, continues to be the central theme in Marc Redfield's "Faces, Traces: Adorno, Kafka, Richter," where he argues very eloquently that Adorno's notion of the "intellectual necessity and uncertainty of art and aesthetics" is reflected in Richter's Betty. For there is "a certain double or ambivalent turn away from legibility" ("art turns its face away but keeps looking at us" [192]) as the "condition of all aesthetic reflection" (188-89). The important point is that while aesthetics, following Adorno, is "demanded by the development of artworks," those works are determined by something outside themselves that remains inaccessible to us. So aesthetics reflects the indeterminate determinacy of art, just as Kafka's ape cannot quite complete the report of his origin he is summoned to submit. In this sense, the truth-content of art is indeed the truth-content of aesthetics, which means the problematic interface that motivated this collection of essays is not unworkable after all. So, perhaps because of Redfield's essay, the admittedly elusive determinacy linking art and aesthetics may yet create a membrane between them.

In "Ecce Pinctura: A Note on Betty's Mastered Irony," Stephen Melville also focuses on Betty's turn, but he is more interested in what she is turning toward -- one of Richter's Grey Paintings, arguably visible in the lower right-hand corner of Betty -- than with what she might be turning away from (e.g., the painter). This account of the turn establishes an alliance between Betty and other paintings that helps to highlight it as a painting and, in contrast to the photograph on which Betty is based (see Richter's Atlas, No. 445), as a work of art that has "a compositional weight or force its exact photographic counterpart lacks" (217). The realization that Betty is not a photograph, as obvious as it may seem despite its photo-realistic appearance, is important to emphasize nonetheless because it is a precondition for Betty's being recognized as a painting. Moreover, it is only through the painting of a photograph that we are able to come to this recognition, because only through the contrast with the "linear perspective rendition of reality" in a photograph do we come to see that the painting is not -- and could not be -- "in perspective the way the photograph is" (217-18). We need to be aware of this difference to see Betty as a painting and specifically as a portrait, which is to say to see Betty in a way that we cannot see her through the photograph. To connect these points more directly to the themes(s) of this collection, Melville is practicing a mode of aesthetics that takes its lead from the work of art as a condition for our recognizing it as such, thereby demonstrating the editors' claim that we do not need to -- and, stronger, should not -- start aesthetics with a definition of art.

The final essay, de Bolla's "Facing Betty's Turn," is as much a concluding essay for the entire collection as it is an essay on Richter's Betty. De Bolla begins with the materiality of the art work (support, size of canvas, pigment, etc.) that, when we encounter it, generates an affective experience indicating "the presence of an artwork." He adds that "it is only the work" -- not aesthetic theory -- "that stakes a claim to art" (225-26), and makes his case by analyzing Betty's turn in a unique way: "her turn is intended to facilitate the transmutation of a likeness into a portrait, giving a face to the turn that is representation" (233). So an encounter with "Betty's turn," a turn toward representation, leads de Bolla "to identify a claim to art" in the form of a sustaining aesthetics (237-38). To summarize, he has an encounter with an object and an affective experience, and then he is able to make sense of his experience by grasping the aesthetic grammar of this artwork, that is, a grammar unique to this work. From which de Bolla concludes: "Herein lies the common territory between aesthetics and the work of art: without the work this aesthetics would not be visible, still less required, and without aesthetics this work would be indiscernible, even unintelligible" (238-39).

De Bolla insists that he can avoid the haunting circularity between aesthetics and the work of art because the conceptual grammar of a work of art can be articulated without any prior appeal to a general theory of art: "the claim that this object makes to artness is sui generis" (226). Moreover, although any number of objects can generate the type of encounter that in turn generates a claim that there is a work of art present, and although there are many such possible encounters in the world, there "can be only one work of art" (227): "There is no general category 'art' to which many distinct objects may belong since the grounding of the artwork … is determined by my own encounter with it" (226). If there is an ontology of art here at all, it is a sparse one indeed. But it is certainly clear that primacy has been given to the work of art, though only insofar as it is mediated by our affective experience.

As I indicated at the start, and as I hope is clear from the intervening discussion, there are many different approaches in this collection to the question of the best way to conceive of the relationship between aesthetics and the work of art, and each essay provides a thoughtful, insightful analysis of a difficult, foundational question in contemporary aesthetics. I believe that aesthetics needs to be regenerated because of the numerous critiques it has been subjected to over the last few decades, and I think it is theorists of the caliber represented in this collection who are going to make it possible for this regeneration to be a success story that could be appreciated by Adorno, Kafka, and Richter and make the ape proud.