After Blanchot: Literature, Criticism, Philosophy

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Leslie Hill, Brian Nelson, and Dimitris Vardoulakis (eds.), After Blanchot: Literature, Criticism, Philosophy, University of Delaware Press, 2006, 277pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 0874139465.

Reviewed by Gerald L. Bruns, University of Notre Dame


Following Maurice Blanchot's death in 2003 at the age of 95 the critic Michael Holland asked: "What are we to make of Blanchot today?" Not much has been made of him so far, Holland says, despite the outburst of scholarship that began in the 1990s (some forty books on him in the last ten years). Holland thinks Blanchot's readers have been looking for him in all the wrong places, preoccupying themselves with his political history, with the presence or absence of "the ethical" in his writings, and more generally with Blanchot as a "theorist," theory being among the many things Blanchot outlived. If Blanchot research is to have a future, Holland says, it should "begin with the fiction and never leave its domain": "Everything that the name 'Blanchot' can be made to signify, for now and in the future, issues from an initial priority given by him to narrative initially from within established generic limits, but eventually extending to the entire domain of his thought."[1]

What Holland means or seems to mean is that Blanchot cannot be identified except as l'écrivain, which is to say the modernist writer whose texts cannot be captured by any genre description or disciplinary framework. He was after all never a writer of narratives in any Aristotelian sense, nor even of novels composed according to recognizable conventions or unitary forms. Even the word "fiction" as applied to certain of his writings came to be enclosed within quotation marks at a very early stage. He was never a philosopher or thinker in the manner of his older or younger contemporaries (whom he nevertheless influenced) -- Sartre, Levinas, Foucault, Deleuze, Derrida. It is quite possible that he never formulated an idea of his own, since much of what he wrote was a reworking of his reading, although it often happened that an idea (e. g., Levinas's Autrui, Bataille's l'expérience) would become something new or strange when he appropriated it. So he is called a "critic" for lack of a better term. If Blanchot came to belong anywhere it is to the tradition (although "tradition" is hardly the word) of fragmentary writing that began with the Jena Romantics and which includes such figures as Gertrude Stein, Wittgenstein, and Paul Celan.

After Blanchot: Literature, Criticism, Philosophy is a volume of essays that attempt in one way or another to address Blanchot's intractable singularity. (Many of the contributions originated at a conference on "Blanchot, the Obscure," held in Melbourne in 2004.) In the lead essay, Christopher Bident, Blanchot's biographer, says that one approach would be to examine the ancient and modern histories of "the neuter" (le Neutre), which is a theme that emerges in Blanchot's writings in many different and paradoxical forms, not the least of which is a conception of temporality as an event of interminable interruption -- a notion (if that is what it is) that Eleanor Kaufman explores here in a splendid essay, "Midnight, or the Inertia of Being," where midnight has the peculiarity that Mallarmé first attached to it as the moment in which past and future recede from one another. Kaufman happily calls this condition of immobility (figured most memorably for Blanchot by Melville's Bartleby the Scrivener) "the great stuckness" (p. 227), which defeats every effort of the world of action and efficiency to dislodge it. Likewise the Neuter is, whatever else it is, the anarchic condition of being refractory to every concept, category, distinction, logic of integration, or rule of identity, which is to say that it describes very well the elusiveness of Blanchot's life and work. It is a secular form of the sacred or of an exteriority (Dehors) without horizon, that is, a space outside of the alternatives of inside and outside, here and there, native and foreign. The paradox is that this absence of horizon is also a condition of finitude. In both his fictional and his discursive writings Blanchot explores the phenomenological question of what it is like to experience this excessive region of exodus, exile, and extravagance. What happens is evidently even more radical than the reversal of consciousness that Hegel describes in his famous account of experience (Erfahrung) in the introduction to the Phenomenology. The possibility of experience itself is turned inside out, rather the way it is in mystical experiences in which one is no longer a subject who can see or hear or experience anything at all.

Among Blanchot scholars Kevin Hart has explored this event more intrepidly than anyone else, and he pursues it again here in "'The Profound Reserve,'" where "reserve" is one more word for the neutral -- a space set apart or in between in which the possibility of experience is itself suspended the way movement is at midnight or the way our gaze is intercepted and reversed by sacred icons. As a thought experiment Hart situates Blanchot among the 8th- and 9th-century "iconodoules" or defenders of the icon as the image of a divine prototype that exposes us to a distance or transcendence of which Blanchot's "Outside" is something like a saving remnant. The idea here is that for Blanchot the image is iconic rather than idolatrous insofar as it grips us in fascination, where fascination is not a cognitive relation but a condition that neutralizes the cognitive subject and withdraws it from the world and all its worldly powers, including its capacity for work -- the making of works, image- and world-making, everything we usually call "art." So, as Hart suggests, Blanchot may be the biggest iconoclast of them all.

So the real question is perhaps not "What to make of Blanchot?" but: "Where does he leave us?" This seems to be the upshot of the title of this collection, as indeed Leslie Hill makes clear in his contribution, "'Affirmation Without Precedent': Maurice Blanchot and Criticism Today" -- where "today" means "after Blanchot" or, much to the same point, after modernism, which, as Adorno argued at the very outset of his Aesthetic Theory, is a movement that is corrosive of our concepts and throws open every question as to what counts as art, literature, or (for all of that) philosophy.[2] With respect to everything that comes before us, we are like Orpheus, before whose gaze everything disappears. Indeed, there is frequent reference in this volume to Blanchot's account of the Orpheus/Eurydice story, and to his essay, "La Disparition de la littérature," from which Hill cites the following:

[It] is the essence of literature to escape any essential determination, any assertion that stabilizes it or even realizes it: it is never already there, it always has to be rediscovered or reinvented. It is not even certain that the word literature or the word art corresponds to anything real, anything possible or anything important… . Whoever asserts literature in itself asserts nothing. Whoever looks for it looks for only what is concealed; whoever finds it finds only what is on this side of literature or, what is worse, beyond it. That is why, finally, it is non-literature that each book pursues as the essence of what it loves and wants passionately to discover.[3]

Here is an aesthetic nominalism more extreme and paradoxical than that of which Adorno complained, and which he tried to overcome dialectically: "That universal elements are irrevocably part of art at the same time that art opposes them, is to be understood in terms of art's likeness to language. For language is hostile to the particular and nevertheless seeks its rescue. Language mediates the particular through universality and in the constellation of the universal, but it does justice to its own universals only when they are not used rigidly in accord with the semblance of their autonomy but are rather concentrated to the extreme on what is specifically to be expressed" (Aesthetic Theory, p. 204). As many of the essays in this volume indicate, everything in Blanchot is aimed at the immobilization of this kind of reasoning on behalf of what lies outside the alternatives of universal and particular -- and therefore outside our capacity to answer questions that begin, "What is…?" In Blanchot's world the propositional style of philosophical thinking has little ground on which to maneuver.

Leslie Hill's question, if I understand, is whether literary criticism in any conventional sense is possible under these anarchic conditions, where

reading is haunted by the spectre of the unreadable. That spectre is a necessary one. Without the prospect of the unreadable, no reading would be able to delimit its own task or purpose, and it would have no object to which to apply itself… . To read at all… is to encounter the unfamiliarity, the strangeness, the otherness of the unreadable. In other words, to read is by necessity to strain towards the point at which its own possibility is put into crisis. When this happens, as it eventually must, it becomes apparent that to read is not simply to scrutinize an object, it is also to be scrutinized by that object in turn (p. 70)

-- as if the text at hand were a kind of icon! (Recall the "nocturnal" experience of words in Blanchot's Celui qui ne m'accompanaît pas.) Hill's practical point about unreadability is, of course, that the transparent text is of no interest to anyone; it is precisely the density or materiality of a work that makes us want to call it literature or, better, poetry. As Mallarmé said, a poem is made of words, but not of any of the things we use words to produce -- a fact which Adorno himself acknowledged when he said that

the task of aesthetics is not to comprehend artworks as hermeneutical objects; in the contemporary situation, it is their incomprehensibility [Unbegreiflichkeit] that needs to be comprehended… . For in that it negates the spirit that dominates nature, the spirit of artworks does not appear as spirit. It ignites on what is opposed to it, on materiality [Er zündet in dem ihm Entgegengesetzten, in der Stofflichkeit]… . Art is redemptive in the act by which the spirit in it throws itself away (Aesthetic Theory, p. 118)

-- the very argument, as Hector Kollias reminds us in these pages, of Blanchot's essay, "La Littérature et la droit à la mort."

The problem is, of course, that over time the reading of any work finds itself engaged in increasingly meticulous acts of refinement, meanwhile taking Cartesian attitudes toward its own history. This may very well be the problem faced by Blanchot studies, where Blanchot is perhaps not "the Obscure" he once was. We continue to "disincorporate" the ideas of "La Littérature et la droit à la mort," "Le Regard d'Orphée," and "Les Deux Versions de l'imaginaire," etc., as if no one had done so before, which is perhaps why Michael Holland proposes that we "begin with the fiction and never leave its domain," since there is no doubt that it is in his récits and fragments that Blanchot will always be found, and where the practice of close reading will be better able to duplicate itself without embarrassment. No doubt what saves us is Blanchot's baroque style, which goes hand in hand with his desire for "an affirmation that has freed itself from every negation"[4] -- what we might think of, following Christopher Fynsk's suggestion in his reading of Blanchot's essay, "L'Indestructible," as his desire for peace or, at all events, non-violent forms of speech and work. What this asks of us, as Fynsk shows, is that we must learn to read non-dialectically and to work through, even if we cannot always understand, the paradoxes that Blanchot opens up for us, like the one that he draws from his reading of Robert Antelme's memoir of Buchenwald, L'Espèce humaine, and which Fynsk turns over and over for half-a-dozen pages without settling its meaning: "Man is the indestructible that can be destroyed."[5] Of course, it remains open to doubt whether the attempt to think outside the alternatives of affirmation and negation -- outside the law of non-contradiction -- can be made philosophically defensible. But that is where Blanchot leaves us, interminably. Perhaps this is why only upscale theologians like Kevin Hart can read him comfortably.

A final point is that there is always room, in any field, for non-specialists. After Blanchot concludes with a fine essay, "White Work," by the Australian sculptor and installation artist, Elizabeth Presa, who describes Rilke's experience of Rodin's "large pavilion of plaster casts" -- dismembered hands, faces, arms, legs, torsos, and breasts whose plaster materiality ("white work") is never still but is transiently opaque or translucent according to the passage of light.

Here was the "sculptural equivalent" of language -- a language "stripped of all convention, ornament, and artifice… that could be held, grasped, stuck together, made to speak in its own way according to its own laws -- a language of infinite generation and regeneration, that would endure all the grafting, shaping, wounding, breaking, scratching and carving performed by the sculptor. (p. 360)

Blanchot's fiction, it turns out, is filled with "white work" -- many of his récits are necrophysical excursions in which the remains of a beloved survive as or like plaster casts that are outside the alternatives of life and death. As if getting at last to the heart of the matter, Presa refers us to Blanchot's analogy between the "plastic work of art" and l'écriture, where both abide in the absolute solitude of an irreal night that Blanchot first began to elucidate in his readings of Rilke, for whom death was merely the side of life that is turned away from us. It is perhaps thanks to Rilke that the death mask of la jeune fille became Blanchot's most sacred icon.[6] Remind me to ask the theologians about this.

[1] "Maurice Blanchot," French Studies, 58, no. 4 (2004): 538.

[2] Aesthetic Theory, trans. Robert Hullot-Kentor (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1997), pp. 1-45.

[3] The Book to Come [1959], trans. Charlotte Mandel (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2003), p. 201.

[4] The Infinite Conversation, trans. Susan Hanson (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1993). p. 209.

[5] The Infinite Conversation, p. 130. Blanchot elucidates (without quite resolving) this paradox in the following way:

The man of the camps is as close as he can be to powerlessness. All human power is outside him, as are existence in the first person, individual sovereignty, and the speech that says 'I.' It is truly as though there were no Self other than the self of those who dominate and to whom he is delivered over without appeal; as though his own self, therefore, having deserted and betrayed him, reigned among those who predominate, leaving him to an anonymous presence without speech and without dignity. And yet this force that is capable of everything has a limit; and he who literally can no longer do anything still affirms himself at the limit where possibility ceases: in the poverty, the simplicity of a presence that is the infinite of human presence. The Powerful One is the master of the possible, but he is not master of this relation that does not derive from mastery and that power cannot measure: the relation without relation wherein the 'other' is revealed as 'autrui.' (The Infinite Conversation, p. 132)

Cf. The Writing of the Disaster, trans. Ann Smock (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press, 1986), p. 76: "Why is skepticism, even when refuted, invincible? Levinas wonders."

[6] In a footnote Presa refers to "L'Inconnue de la Seine" -- "the name given to the death mask made of a young girl found drowned in the Seine at the quai du Louvre in the late nineteenth century. During the first decades of the twentieth century copies of a young woman's death mask were widely sold in France and in Germany and hung on the walls of many houses." She notes that Blanchot kept a cast of "L'Inconnue de la Seine" at his house in Éze where he came to live following World War II.