After the Beautiful: Hegel and the Philosophy of Pictorial Modernism

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Robert B. Pippin, After the Beautiful: Hegel and the Philosophy of Pictorial Modernism, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 159pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226079493.

Reviewed by Ingvild Torsen, University of Oslo


The cover of this book is a detail from one of Cézanne's Bathers (he painted this motif several times), a painting that raises several of the questions Robert Pippin asks: What is this painting of or about, since the bodies look more like heavy, opaque matter than embodied agents doing anything, like swimming by the river bank? Why would Cézanne paint what could be such a beautiful, picturesque scene this way? And what would the answers to these questions say about Cézanne and his time? Pippin's aim is to show how Hegel can provide a way to start formulating interesting answers to these questions and how Hegel can do so precisely because he offers a framework in which the aesthetic, the historical, the socio-political and the larger metaphysical questions about agency and the intelligibility of being are all connected. That is quite ambitious for such a short book. Still the result is an extremely interesting and suggestive work that is full of ideas, artworks, some quite convincing arguments and (in the footnotes) further intriguing connections and associations.

The book has its origin in the Adorno lectures Pippin gave at the Goethe University in Frankfurt in 2011. It brings together strands of thought from his previous work on art and on Hegel's practical philosophy. (Pippin has written frequently on visual art, as well as cinema and literature, over the last two decades, many of the pieces appearing in Critical Inquiry and some reprinted in the 2005 collection The Persistence of Subjectivity). He develops his interpretation of Hegel's philosophy of art by bringing it into conversation with three interlocutors (one imagines three voices that Pippin himself finds it productive to be in conversation with as he thinks about modernism as a philosophical and aesthetic problem): the art historians T. J. Clark and Michael Fried and the philosopher Martin Heidegger.

The text has grown substantially from its initial lecture form and consists of four chapters. The first is a lengthy introduction presenting a picture of the Hegelian project as Pippin conceives it, which is helpful for readers unfamiliar with Hegel. The second develops a Hegelian account of modernist painting, using Manet as its example. The third develops this account and makes it more concrete by engaging two other stories about modernism in painting, those of Clark and Fried, both of whom Pippin understands as deeply Hegelian. The final is devoted to the philosophically most ambitious contender to the Hegelian story, an alternative account present in the tradition from Schelling to Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty, represented here by Heidegger's essay "The Origin of the Work of Art" (at times with some backup from Merleau-Ponty). The Hegelian approach is ultimately defended by noting its advantages over this alternative account.

Central for understanding Pippin's Hegel are two metaphors: the problem posed by our "amphibian" status and the image of the artwork as a thousand-eyed Argus. We humans are amphibian beings in that we are corporeal bodies, part of material nature, and also meaning-making, reason-responsive subjects. How to understand ourselves as both is "the deepest problem in modern self-understanding" (p. 65). It is important to note that this amphibian status is a historical phenomenon for Pippin and Hegel (rather than the traditional metaphysical problem). "We have produced such a being," so what we need is not a philosophical account, but a historically situated understanding that allows us to be satisfied with ourselves as having such a dual nature, without transcending or denying one or the other of our aspects (p. 46). The amphibian problem is hence connected to freedom, the telos of this Hegelian narrative: a kind of self-reconciliation that allows me to see myself in my own deeds, which means standing behind them and defending them.

The metaphor of the thousand-eyed Argus is so central to Pippin's project that it is worth quoting Hegel here. Hegel claims art

makes every one of its productions into a thousand-eyed Argus, whereby the inner soul and spirit is seen at every point. And it is not only the bodily form, the look of the eyes, the countenance and posture, but also actions and events, speech and tones of voice, and the series of their course through all conditions of appearance that art has everywhere to make into an eye, in which the free soul is revealed in its inner infinity. (Aesthetics 1:154-55, as quoted in Pippin p. 49)

The analogy here is between understanding another person through his or her appearance and actions and understanding the work of art through its many particulars, formal as well as those relating to subject-matter. On Pippin's interpretation the right response to such a being is interrogative. The attempt to see into the soul of a many-eyed creature cannot be settled once and for all, but remains open and contentious ("even when confronted by a two-eyed creature, the task of figuring out what is revealed in someone's eyes is obviously not straightforward," p. 49). In addition, whatever the intention or meaning of the artwork itself, it is only what it intends to be if its way of being fits the "objective social conditions of an age" that surrounds it (e.g., one could intend to make a joke but fail, due to changed norms about a stereotype; a painting might intend to give you nothing but the beauty of a naked woman, but fail, given changing social conditions in which the naked body is recognized as an object of consumption) (p. 61).

When these two metaphors are connected, we get at the heart of the Hegelian version of pictorial modernism: the question facing art by the end of the 19th century is how or whether who we are, with our unresolved, amphibian status, can be successfully represented artistically in a thousand-eyed Argus, that is, whether shared aesthetic intelligibility is even possible anymore. Pippin's aim is to understand the aesthetic problem of modernist art -- the radical transformation of visual art in the period from 1860 and the next hundred years suggests there was such a problem -- as a manifestation of the "amphibian" problem. The result is an incredibly interesting way to think of both who we are as modern subjects and how aesthetic modernism expresses precisely this problem.

All this rather abstract and difficult Hegelian material becomes easier to grasp when brought into conversation with art historians in chapter three. The discussion of Manet's Olympia is a particularly helpful example: what do we see if we interrogate the painting, if we look into the many eyes of this Argus? According to Clark as glossed by Pippin, we see a prostitute lying down, staring at us in a detached manner. We see how the social -- here the norms for meaning-making within capitalism -- forms sexuality, our biological nature. Hence the painting represents a version of the amphibian problem: Olympia offers a shocking picture of ourselves (according to Clark, of our capitalist society as necessarily implying prostitution) that does not offer the kind of satisfaction that we would want. What we learn about ourselves here, that the naked human body has become a commodity, also has consequences for the genre of the nude in painting: it cannot be credible anymore -- "Olympia is not a nude; she is a naked individual, and that now assumes a different meaning in the context of modern Paris" (p. 77). "Innocently" taking pleasure in Olympia as an embodiment of ideal beauty is no longer a historical possibility.

A Hegelian account should, however, be able not just to explain the change in art as a function of a change in social order, but also to allow us to understand how, from within the practice of visual art-making itself, the particular change that we see in Manet is warranted. This is where Pippin turns to Fried, not as a challenge, but as a complement to Clark. Fried  analyses the relationship of beholder, work and tradition as moments of a first-person phenomenology of how the painting works. Here the notions of absorption and theatricality are central. This allows us to explain Olympia's almost obtrusively detached stare as it works aesthetically, as an anti-theatrical strategy of "facingness." By using Fried, Pippin interprets Manet's work as an attempt, from within the tradition of representational painting, to maintain aesthetic intelligibility in an age of skepticism about the possibility of shared intelligibility tout court.

For those wondering about Hegel's claims about the end of art and the surpassing of art by religion and philosophy, it might be helpful to mention where Pippin thinks Hegel goes wrong, since that also dissolves some of the potential problems with Hegel's historical narrative about art. Pippin openly admits that we need to revise Hegel where the latter suggests we could transcend corporeal nature altogether and leave the amphibian problem behind (such a view would be nondialectical, so denying it is a way to "make Hegel more Hegelian" (p. 45)). Pippin also thinks that Hegel was far too optimistic about the nature of modern society and the possibility of realizing freedom. By contrast, Pippin comes across as much more a skeptic: "Hegel did not sufficiently take into account the inherently unresolvable or perennial character of the problem of freedom," (p. 65).

The final chapter makes a lengthy excursus into Heidegger's aesthetic theory, seeing him as a representative of the strongest contender to the Hegelian account of aesthetic modernism. The alternative tradition, which runs from Schelling through Schopenhauer, Nietzsche of The Birth of Tragedy, to Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty (and which still has some traction today) emphasizes the artwork as disclosing a fundamental truth not just about us, but about the meaning of being. Schematically put, whereas Hegel's philosophy of art is oriented around the task of "realization of freedom," the tradition Heidegger represents is oriented around "ontological disclosure." Pippin notes the many parallels between Heidegger's and Hegel's approaches. They both recognize art as a historically inflected phenomenon, since they are about truth and hence able to reveal something of importance; as having its very possibility brought into question in late modernity; and as being best understood as something that happens, in an interplay between work, tradition, beholders and artists. Still, the differences in approach run deep. Pippin stresses the difference in the understanding of intelligibility (for Hegel, to be is to be intelligible, while for Heidegger, being has a dimension beyond intelligibility, what he calls earth in the art-essay). However, in the end it seems to me that the difference that makes the strongest case for Hegel's approach over Heidegger's has to do with the way the event of art can be understood: the event character of art can on Hegel's story also be understood as a deed, as something achieved by and amongst us, whereas Heidegger emphasizes the artwork as something that happens to us.

The contrast can be seen in the different interpretations the two traditions suggest of a modernist work like Cézanne's Bathers. On a Heideggerian reading (which Pippin supplements with points from Merleau-Ponty), what happens in this painting can be described as a "making-present": we see the coming into being of significance in these figures; Cézanne is "doing ontology." What a Heideggerian account is lacking is the ability to understand this not merely as an "event of being" but also as a deed, Cézanne's deed. In the words of Pippin, the elemental character of Cézanne's paintings is "not a matter of some Heideggerian fullness of being," but instead "what is credibly available in Cézanne's world" (p. 125). Even though Heidegger is historically sensitive -- the reason the truth happening in Cezanne's painting looks just like this (and not say, like the paradigmatic Greek artwork) is historical -- what the work is about is always understood on the level of ontology of what is as such, what we might call "the event of being." By contrast, the careful, multidimensional interpretation of the thousand-eyed Argus, exemplified by Pippin's use of Fried and Clark to analyze Manet's work, is not available to Heidegger. Neither questions of social organization, e.g., the commercialization of sexuality, nor the particulars of the phenomenology of art, e.g., how one looks at representations of people in the 20th Century, are of interest to Heidegger.

It is striking how well Pippin writes about Heidegger, giving us one of the more insightful presentations of his philosophy of art and a very powerful criticism that is still formulated from within, on Heidegger's own terms. Even if the upshot is ultimately to stress the strength of the Hegelian position -- there is just less to say (and learn) from Heidegger's event than from Hegel's deed -- Heidegger is not used as a mere foil, but read generously and with insight. That said, this is also one of the places where Pippin's engagement with his interlocutors seems the least conclusive. Certainly, the phenomenological tradition, and perhaps especially Merleau-Ponty, has quite a lot more to say about the relationship between embodiment, identity and intelligibility than what is discussed here. (An indication of this is that a source of inspiration for Fried, the interlocutor that brings the "first-person phenomenology of art" to the Hegelian account Pippin is constructing, is precisely Merleau-Ponty, and not Hegel). In the case of those strange bathing bodies by the water, it seems like the alternative tradition has something to add to the story that is not present in the Hegelian account. Merleau-Ponty holds that the body is not only a site of socially constructed identities, a mode of expression or a potentially facing refusal of communication or reconciliation, but also has a silent, unknown depth that is the site and origin of the mindedness and meaning-making activities of the human being. This aspect of our embodiment cannot itself be grasped as an intelligible object and is analogous to the aspect of the artwork that Heidegger names "earth." In the spirit of Merleau-Ponty, we might say that it is some of that underlying, mute "raw being" in us that we catch a glimpse of in the heavy, opaque bodies of Cezanne's Bathers.

It is also striking how relatively unusual Pippin's book is. Most monographs published on the Post-Kantian aesthetic tradition either are introductions or aim for a certain scholarly completeness., This book has the feeling of opening up an ongoing research project. Even though the volume is slim, the topic appears very rich, and it is exciting to read an author whose interests and expertise have such a wide span. This is the kind of book that will make its reader want to pursue the conversation in different directions -- read some T. J. Clark, revisit Pippin's work on agency and his debate with McDowell, or look more closely at Cezanne's paintings (the book includes several illustrations, but it is hard, using small reproductions, to do justice to some of the magnificent works discussed). This feature certainly testifies to Pippin's ability to make the Hegelian themes he discusses come alive and to the fruitfulness of engaging Post-Kantian thought, also after Hegel.