Afterness: Figures of Following in Modern Thought and Aesthetics

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Gerhard Richter, Afterness: Figures of Following in Modern Thought and Aesthetics, Columbia University Press, 2011, 262pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231157704.

Reviewed by Tom Huhn, School of Visual Arts


Gerhard Richter's fourth monograph, subtitled "Figures of Following in Modern Thought and Aesthetics," is a wide-ranging collection of eleven chapters, each of which bears a title that begins with 'Afterness.' (Versions of the majority of the chapters appeared earlier as published essays.) Under the rubric of Afterness, some of the many writers Richter comments upon and attempts to bring together include Adorno, Arendt, Benjamin, Bloch, Brecht, Derrida, Heidegger, Kafka, Kant, and Lyotard. An introductory chapter on what Richter describes as the "Logic of Afterness" explains, "My neologism afterness (Nachheit in German) denotes a rhetorical, intellectual, and experiential phenomenon that emerges from our understanding of lateness, supersession, and posteriority" (9). 'Afterness,' then, is a neologism invented in the need to gather together and make more cohesive the many different locutions for naming whatever it is that comes after something else, as well as whatever it is that might happen when something follows something else. Afterness, we could thus say, serves here as a catch-all category for the great varieties of ways in which something follows something else. But it is just this administering together under one rubric the "figures of following" that, I believe, makes the project of the book, and so too of afterness, deeply problematic and, finally, quite counterproductive.

Richter explains that, "Furthermore, the concept of afterness represents an attempt to acknowledge -- in an unconventional way, to be sure -- the theoretical consequences of a semantic element that is central to the German language" (9). If afterness is indeed an experiential phenomenon due largely to its "central" location in the German language, I wonder whether afterness ought indeed qualify as a correct term for something constitutive, arguably, of experience. A reader ponders what to make of the fact that the leitmotif of the book is Lyotard's remark -- following the work of the American artist Joseph Kosuth -- that "After philosophy comes philosophy. But it is altered by the after" (14). Is the experience and understanding of afterness altered by its having been expressed in French, and altered still further by Richter, following Lyotard, following Kosuth? Richter no doubt would have to agree that, yes, the after always alters. But -- and here is the rub in the project -- if the after always alters (whatever was before), what purchase can, or should, a concept of afterness have on experience and understanding? That is, and as I understand Richter's project, what comes after is always a dynamic, perhaps even destabilizing event, whereas afterness, instead, as a concept and category for the understanding, provides that which seeks to install some measure of stasis and conformity under a stabilizing, comprehensive, and all-encompassing term. Again, the project seems perplexing, here too especially when one considers that the bulk of Richter's book consists of explications of texts. One might rather imagine that a more genuine and good faith commitment to following (what comes) after would not so readily resign itself to saying, describing, and explicating the afterness of each text. The book nonetheless has much to recommend it in the form of numerous commentaries on significant aspects of the thinking of the long list of writers mentioned above. There is much to be learned from its many fine commentaries and explications.

At a few crucial moments Richter seems aware of the potential paradox at the heart of his project. Consider what he writes in the final pages of the Introduction in an attempt to distinguish his project from all those that presume to know the full extent of their objects of study:

Here, by contrast, the after will be kept open -- that is, will be shown always to have kept itself open -- as the site of competing significations and claims that have the capacity to surprise us in their idiomatic singularity and in their refusal to be absorbed without remainder into the master narratives, valuable and reassuring as they are, of causal and linear unfolding (21).

However legitimate the concern with what might be called the prefiguration of thought, it is nevertheless betrayed here when the sentence begins with the consistency, stability, and permanence implied by the term "the after". Is this category of afterness not itself, as Richter so often writes, always and already, a kind of master narrative?

One wants to suggest that a concern with afterness should instead increase the vigilance toward maintaining distinctions among the varieties of ways and things and events that follow. But Richter's zeal to collect together and reduce to one name a manifold of perhaps very different things leads him to fail to observe an until now -- with the leveling effect of afterness -- quite important distinction between two of the most prominent forms of textual following, that between commentary and critique. In the final paragraph of his Introduction Richter inserts the last line of Adorno's Negative Dialectics and follows it not with critique but commentary. This is especially surprising given that the key point of this paragraph is to define afterness as critique, indeed in terms of the "singular, nonidentical moment of the afterness of critique" (25). But Richter instead concludes by writing:

The after is thus the scene of an interminable transference, of perpetual marginality, and still-pending supersession. As Adorno's Negative Dialectics puts it in its final sentence, a kind of after-word [sic] that conditions all the sentences of criticism and commentary still to come: 'Only if what is can be changed is that which is not all [Nur wenn, was ist, sich ändern läβt, ist das, was ist, nicht alles].' This possibility would be an already assumed, and thus anticipated, afterness of critique (25).

Why does Richter so readily characterize Adorno's "only if" as "possibility," when "possibility" might be just that which forestalls our encounter with "what is"? And why does he, still further, designate possibility as the "afterness of critique," when the very sentence he transcribes from Negative Dialectics quite pointedly refuses to intimate, and especially not designate, whatever it might be about "what is" that allows it not to be everything? One wants to say, after Richter's comments on Adorno, that it is instead precisely the "already assumed, and thus anticipated" that Adorno's sentence would like to protect us from.

The unlikelihood that Richter can answer these questions without undermining the prospects for the whole project of afterness is pressing. It points to the central difficulty of the book: how to understand and locate Richter's terminological and hermeneutic intervention and extension -- of Adorno's words, but so too those of the many other authors treated. These commentaries are inaugurated here with the inability to discern the difference between critique and commentary. Worse still, commentary mistakes itself for critique. To ignore the problem of whether commentary is an afterness, we might nonetheless aver only that commentary is, at most, a not necessarily interesting or compelling afterness.

If we set aside the problems with Richter's characterization of the project of afterness, we can turn to what might be learned by reading portions of the book according to its own criteria of the "interminable transference, perpetual marginality, and still-pending supersession" that are the marks of genuine afterness. The lengthiest chapter is titled "Afterness and Translation: The Politics of Carrying Across," and deals chiefly with Heidegger's remarks on Schiller's Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Mankind, from the published typescript of the former's 1936/37 seminar in Freiburg. The question of translation here is not regarding that from German to English but rather involves Heidegger's attempts to understand the import of the 'on', or 'over' [über], in the title of Schiller's Letters, and thereby to think about the nature of being brought over from the sensuous to the aesthetic state, or condition [Zustand], and what it might thus mean to be carried across, or carried over, from any one state to another. The essay concludes with Richter’s summoning the image of a bridge as that which best makes visible Heidegger's intimations regarding translation and carrying over:

To think of translation as a bridge between texts, in the sense of a Stiftung, or 'founding,' is to acknowledge that the slippery bridge that is translation, whether it is crossed by Heidegger or by Schiller, neither simply marks nor re-marks but constitutes the very condition of possibility for linguistic interpretation. Far from being a mere afterthought that follows the so-called original, the bridge of translation in its afterness writes into existence modes of signification that become visible as decidedly relational and non-self-identical phenomena. Any theory, practice, or politics of translation to come would have to begin with the bridge spawned by this afterness (116-117).

Bridges are, for the most part, not portable or flexible structures. Indeed, the insistence above that the bridge of translation constitutes the very possibility for interpretation acknowledges the fixed and foundational character of translation. And since the bridge is "spawned" by the afterness of translation, and of linguistic interpretation in general, should we not conclude that the gist of the chapter is to inform us that the act of saying or attempting to convey the meaning of anything always also begins with the assertion that an "original" has some meaning to be deciphered? That is, the assertion that something has meaning, the ascription of meaning, is to place something in relation to something else, and to likewise assert that the status of the meaning asserted is also distinct from the thing that has meaning. Is this not the meaning of the statement that "afterness writes into existence modes of signification that become visible as decidedly relational and non-self-identical phenomena"?

But bridges, historically, have also been subject to decay, or to being washed out, or worse still, to being bombed. The problem with what might be called Richter's constructivist view of meaning is that it fails to account for events, for things happening to, and in response to, assertions of meaning. No doubt there are also events that are themselves translations of things, and things (in addition to bridges) that are translations of events. More problematic still is the failure to meet the project's own criteria in the assertion that "Any theory, practice, or politics of translation to come would have to begin with the bridge spawned by this afterness." How well does this decree fit with the project's criteria regarding the "interminable transference, perpetual marginality, and still-pending supersession" of afterness? Not at all well.

In another chapter, "Afterness and Experience (II): Crude Thinking Rethought," Richter considers Brecht's somewhat well-known term, and exhortation, in favor of crude thinking [plumpes Denken]. Richter is in fact following Fredric Jameson, who in his 1976 essay "Criticism and History" sought to defend Brecht's plumpes Denken. Richter offers Jameson's own words in the latter's argument that "plumpes Denken is not a position in its own right, but the demystification of some prior position from which it derives its . . . momentum and of which it comes as a genuinely Hegelian Aufhebung" (178). And Richter rightly comments that for Jameson plumpes Denken is thus to be recommended precisely since it offers itself as no genuine term of mediation or presentation in its own right but rather as a thing that acts merely in substitution of something else. Hence, and as Jameson asserted, the purpose and goal of plumpes Denken is to serve the act of demystification. Richter, seeking and positioning himself as an afterness in relation to Jameson, as well as to Brecht, then asks, "What if plumpes Denken were not always and crudely self-identical, as in Jameson's account, but could be opened up to the ways in which it is also at odds with itself, at once crude and subtle?" (179). In other words, plumpes Denken is to be expanded, precisely through the interpretive strategy of afterness, as something that is not only crude [plumpes] but now also "subtle". This seems, if I understand it correctly, not only thoroughly wrong-headed and counter-subversive (might we say reactionary?) but also, again, strikingly at odds with the purported characterization of the "opening up" that is to be the hallmark of afterness. Plumpes Denken is not at odds with itself, rather, the opposition is between, on the one hand, the strategic, political intelligence of Brecht, and, on the other, the character of crude thinking, precisely in its thorough-going crudeness. The crude thinking recommended by Brecht (crude thinking that recommends itself no doubt arises out of an entirely different strategy and political position than Brecht's) presumably has its force insofar as it is a strategy deployed on the part of an intelligence that cannot achieve what it seeks through the usual intelligent techniques of clarity, analysis, insight, argument and persuasion.

In order to transform crudeness into something at odds with itself, something inherently also subtle, do we not need to deny both the full force of whatever power crude thinking might once have been imagined by a Brecht to contain, as well as to deny the very character of crudeness itself? In Richter's attempt to argue for the subtlety of crudeness -- again, not as a strategy following from the presumably non-crudeness of Richter's thinking -- I believe we might even spy a glimpse of the overarching strategy of afterness: to perform retroactively the act of undoing the purported one-sidedness of whatever is perceived as preceding such an act. Afterness attains its power and warrant by presuming the limitations of whatever precedes it. Plumpes Denken is an especially good test case for afterness because crude thinking so thoroughly pronounces its own limitations. Thus, crude thinking in effect forestalls any retroactive claims in regard to its nature and extent by setting its own limits.

Yet in Richter's hands even crudeness falls victim to the power of afterness to open up just those forms of thought and action that declare themselves complete and thereby closed to retrospective transformation. In the case of plumpes Denken we can see finally how afterness moves beyond providing commentary and instead becomes critique, just that which Richter sets as its standard. However, the critique which opens up crude thinking to locate within it the very subtlety with which it inaugurates itself by foreswearing is no achievement, and especially not one on behalf of crude thinking. Why transform and thereby dilute the capacity of plumpes Denken? Brecht offers crude thinking out of a realization of the limitations of sophisticated thinking to achieve certain political as well as intellectual ends. Making crude thinking sophisticated enough to be subtle is no triumph by, or for, crude thinking. Rather, it is a cunning achievement of the subtle sophistications of the openness of intellect. This re-instrumentalizing of intellect for the sake of "opening up" crude thinking is a reassertion of the triumph of thought once again over itself. Mind is, afterness and all again, as the Brits once liked to say, too clever by half.