Against Those in the Disciplines

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Sextus Empiricus, Against Those in the Disciplines, Richard Bett (tr., intro.), Oxford University Press, 2018, 270pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198712701.

Reviewed by Stéphane Marchand, Université Paris 1 Panthéon-Sorbonne


How can anyone claim that music, or grammar, is non-existent? How can we deny the existence of well-known and established practices such as rhetoric, geometry, arithmetic, and even astrology? How can anyone be against grammarians, rhetoricians, geometricians, arithmeticians, and musicians? In Adversus Mathematicos I-IV, Sextus Empiricus explores such issues. Against Those in the Disciplines is Richard Bett's new translation of Adversus Mathematicos I-VI (AM I-VI, often translated as Against the Professors). It follows his translation of Adversus Mathematicos VII-XI (Against the Logicians, Against the Physicists and Against the Ethicists; hereafter AM VII-XI).[1]

The overall project of the six treatises (AM I: Against the Grammarians; AM II: Against the rhetoricians; AM III: Against the Geometers; AM IV: Against the Arithmeticians; AM V: Against the Astrologers; AM VI: Against the Musicians) is not to deny the existence of those disciplines per se or of those practicing them. It is rather to show that there are grounds for suspending our judgment about the validity of the theoretical foundations of those disciplines and about their usefulness, in the same way that Sextus proves the necessity to suspend judgment about the whole of dogmatic philosophy in the rest of his work.

AM I-VI is the poor cousin in the Pyrrhonian family; in comparison with the huge recent literature on the Outlines of Pyrrhonism or even on AM VII-XI, those treatises have been widely neglected. In English, for instance, this is the first full translation since R.G. Bury's Loeb which dates backs to 1949; and out of the six treatises, only Against the Grammarians, Against the Astrologers and Against the Musicians have benefited from a separate edition.[2] We can hope that this new translation, given its clarity, will open up new perspectives for scholarship on Pyrrhonism. On top of the obvious connections between this and the rest of Sextus' work, Bett shows that the treatises also introduce a certain variety in the Pyrrhonian philosophical routine.

In his introduction, Bett discusses the peculiarities of those six treatises compared to the rest of Sextus' extant work. First of all, those peculiarities are due to the subject matter of the treatise: Sextus is no longer attacking the dogmatism of the philosophers but the dogmatism of the specific kind of scientist of his time (or to be precise of a century before his time, since the knowledge he is attacking is not precisely up-to-date). For that reason, the treatises offer counter-arguments against those disciplines, mainly in order to show that each of those disciplines is grounded on false principles and is inefficient at giving the skills they purport to: e.g. grammarians are unable to justify their rules and knowledge of those rules does not guarantee the ability to speak good Greek. In the same way, Sextus shows that rhetoric as a technique with theoretical foundations rests on weak principles (as Plato's Gorgias shows, and Sextus refers to those arguments). He also shows that rhetoricians (i.e., the theoreticians of rhetoric) are not necessarily good orators, and that good orators need not know rhetoric in order to be persuasive. Thus those five treatises -- especially the first, Against Grammarians, which is significantly longer -- provide interesting arguments against those disciplines, showing the existence of long-standing reflection on the foundations of those scientific -- or pseudo-scientific -- techniques.

In that respect, Bett's translation is very useful as it provides, in short notes, a great deal of technical information explaining the debates about grammar, rhetoric, geometry, arithmetic, astrology and music. Admittedly, for an understanding of the grammatical technicalities referred to in AM I, the reference edition remains Blank's Against the Grammarians (Oxford 1998), as Bett explains. However, the interest of this new book is to provide a complete translation of those treatises and an interpretation from the point of view of the recent scholarship on Pyrrhonism.

For instance, Richard Bett makes a good point in his introduction by showing that one of the peculiarities of this treatise is that it provides counter-arguments against the disciplines from the Epicurean corpus, notably in AM I, AM III -- for the much discussed topic of the existence of an Epicurean geometry, cf. AM III, 98 and the note ad loc. -- and AM VI, for which the new edition of the Epicurean Philodemus' De Musica by D. Delattre reveals common arguments.[3] But the proximity to the Epicureans is not limited to borrowing arguments demonstrating the uselessness of disciplines (cf. for instance AM VI, 4): as Bett shows, it is linked to a form of minimalism both in a theoretical and an ethical respect. For that very reason, as Sextus himself acknowledges (in AM I, 1), there is something "quite common" (κοινότερον) -- which, in my opinion, makes more sense than "quite generally" -- between the attack of the two schools against those in the disciplines, even if "their attitudes were not the same". Pyrrhonians and Epicureans share the idea that the disciplines are useless for what they think philosophy's purpose is.

Furthermore, this edition proposes an accurate analysis of Sextus' skeptical strategy in these books. In his previous work, Bett showed the variety of skeptical strategies in Sextus' other writings. He also claimed -- convincingly in my opinion even if this position is not shared by everyone[4] -- that the Outlines of Pyrrhonism presents a form of skepticism posterior to AM VII-XI. By studying every mention made by Sextus of his own work in order to identify its precise reference, Bett brings out that it is often easier to see in AM I-VI precise references to AM VII-XI than to PH. Hence by mentioning the Skeptical Treatises (AM I, 26, 29 and AM VI, 52) or the Pyrrhonians, Sextus refers AM VII-XI (cf. p. 234 n. 81). Given that, one can be tempted to infer that AM I-VI could be anterior to PH; but, on the other hand, the introduction shows that there is no real difference between the kinds of skepticism in PH and in AM I-VI. Contrary to what happens in AM XI (in Bett's interpretation), the negative arguments of the kind "x does not exist" (where x is an art, or a discipline) do not entail negative dogmatism. In AM I-VI Sextus presents counter-arguments to the thesis that "x does exist" in order to suspend judgment (cf. AM I, 6). For this reason, Bett shows it is possible to understand the strategy of AM I-VI by referring to the principles described in PH I.

Nevertheless, this compatibility between AM I-VI and PH does not imply the absence of traces of an earlier phase of skepticism in AM I-VI (cf. p. 14 n. 27). It is highly probable that Sextus is using materials from earlier writings where negative dogmatism was not such a problem in order to contradict the thesis of the validity of the disciplines. Admittedly, the thesis pro the disciplines often remains unmentioned and Sextus could have mentioned the fact that his purpose produces epochè more often. However, this general approach seems to work without requiring the hypotheses that Sextus was making editorial blunders by combining incompatible strategies without even noticing it. Hence, regarding the interpretation of the place of AM I-VI in Sextus' work, this edition remains very skeptical. Until now, most scholars thought that AM I-VI was the last work of Sextus Empiricus,[5] but Bett seems to think that this is a case of indecidability since there are arguments for both sides. On the one hand, AM I-VI shares features that are precisely in AM VII-XI and, on the other, the skepticism of AM I-VI is compatible with PH.

This case is another argument in favor of Against Those in the Disciplines being self-sufficient and not needing to make reference to another book to explain its project. Admittedly there is nothing comparable in AM I-VI to the 'general exposition' of skepticism in PH I, which is a complete presentation of the nature, the goal and the method of skepticism. Nevertheless, the introduction in AM I, 1-8 presents succinctly the skeptical context of the treatises, and it seems that the whole is designed with a rather systematic scheme to present arguments against the disciplines from the more general to the more specific. It is for this reason that the "general exposition" in PH -- which was also present in the lost books of the Skeptical Treatises, cf. AM VII, 1 -- has been replaced by a quick overview of the skeptical project of the book (cf. AM I, 1-8) and by some general arguments against the disciplines (AM I, 9-40).

Regarding the kind of arguments used by Sextus in AM I-VI, the introduction and the notes emphasize a preference for "general arguments" against the principles or the basic concepts of a discipline, in order to give a radical critique of the discipline without going into its details, which seems to be a characteristic of the Academics rather than of the Pyrrhonians. This strategy is often introduced by the "siege simile" (cf. AM I, 40 n.) By this strategy, Sextus can use some philosophical arguments from AM VII-XI. For instance, theoretical debates on the existence of time can be used against music, and debates on the real existence of lines or points can be used against geometry. This strategy can be found in the other works of Sextus but in AM I-VI the strategy is conceived as the presentation of "the effective things -- τὰ πραγματικῶς λεγόμενα -- said against [the disciplines]" (cf. AM I, 7 and the note).

But the aim of AM I-VI is not only critical, or at least the critique gives way to positive commitments. The criticism of the disciplines comes with the claim that there is "an everyday, practical counterpart of the field whose credentials he [Sextus] is attacking" (p. 16): the attack against grammar as a "science" or an "expert skill" leaves literacy untouched (AM I, 49-53), the ability to read and write, and in the same way the attacks against the disciplines is not a critique of empirical skills like "farming, navigation" (AM V, 2), or the ability to play musical instruments, which does not need any dogmatic commitment and which fits with "the observation applied to apparent things" (AM I, 2). In the same fashion, in its arguments against grammar, AM I shows a pragmatic approach to language which is really interesting6: the only valuable criterion for judging correct usage of language is "the non-expert and unsophisticated observation that is in line with ordinary life and the common usage of most people" (see AM I, 179 and AM II, 59). Hence, there is good Greek for the skeptics: it is the Greek "in line with the usage of each of the Greeks and is conducted by modeling and observation in everyday talk" (AM I, 176, with the accurate note on παραπλασμός). Indeed from AM I, 180 it is possible -perhaps more systematically than Bett does in this edition- to bring out what could be a skeptical style.

This very criterion, usage, can be helpful for evaluating Bett's new edition. Translating AM I-VI is not an easy task, since it is a very technical book with many references to ancient disciplines, and ancient debates about those techniques. Bett has made very coherent choices about Sextus' principal terms. He never simply defaults to the etymologically related counterpart term in English: he is really translating, that is transferring meanings into another language for readers who are not necessarily acquainted with the technical subtleties of the Greek vocabulary. For instance, he chooses to translate γραμματιστική by "literacy", where Blank and Pellegri have "grammar". In a similar fashion he chooses to translate ἀνωμαλία by "lack of uniformity", where most translations choose "anomaly" (cf. p. 79 n.). In addition, each of these choices, and technical points more generally, are concisely explained in notes.

In addition to the translation and introduction, the book provides an analytic outline of the argument of the work, a list of the numerous people mentioned by Sextus, a glossary of the many technical terms discussed, a very useful list of the parallels between these treatises and Sextus' other works, and a bibliography which includes not only English references, but also languages like French, Italian and German.

To conclude, this new translation is highly recommended for scholars as well as for students interested in Ancient Skepticism.

[1] Richard Bett, ed., Sextus Empiricus. Against the Ethicists (Adversus Mathematicos XI), Clarendon later ancient philosophers (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997); Richard Bett, ed., Sextus Empiricus. Against the Logicians (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005); Richard Bett, ed., Sextus Empiricus. Against the Physicists (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012).

[2] Sextus Empiricus, Against the grammarians : adversus mathematicos I, ed. David L Blank, Clarendon later ancient philosophers, (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998); Sextus Empiricus, Against the musicians (adversus musicos): a new critical text and translation on facing pages, ed. Denise Davidson Greaves (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press, 1986); Emidio Spinelli, ed., Sextus Empiricus. Contro gli astrologi, Elenchos (Napoli: Bibliopolis, 2000).

[3] Philodème, Sur la Musique. Livre IV, ed. Daniel Delattre, 2 vols. (Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2007).

[4] See for instance Emidio Spinelli, "Sextus Empiricus," in Dictionnaire Des Philosophes Antiques, ed. Richard Goulet, vol. VI (Paris: CNRS Éditions, 2016), 265-300.

[5] Edgar Krentz, "Philosophic Concerns in Sextus Empiricus, 'Adversus Mathematicos' I," Phronesis 7, no. 2 (1962): 153.