Agency, Freedom, and Moral Responsibility

Placeholder book cover

Andrei Buckareff, Carlos Moya, and Sergi Rosell (eds.), Agency, Freedom, and Moral Responsibility, Palgrave Macmillan, 2015, 293pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137414946.

Reviewed by Robyn Repko Waller, King's College London


This anthology features sixteen original papers on issues of agency, including aspects shared across human and nonhuman agents alike. The volume caters heavily to the nature of human agency. Free and responsible agency, its nature and its existence, is tackled from a diversity of angles, inclusive of its relation to the nature of time, determinism and indeterminism, luck, rationality, alternatives, desert, ownership, and moral edification. A good portion of the contributions focuses on moral obligation. The chapters lean toward discussions of leeway conditions for responsibility, although sourcehood conditions and ownership of action are addressed in several chapters. Regarding free will and moral responsibility, a healthy selection of accounts come from compatibilists and incompatibilists alike, as well as both causalist and noncausalist theorists of action. Moral responsibility skepticism is represented in multiple discussions. Given the breadth and depth of the material, my modest aim here is to offer thematic summaries of swatches of the collection, along with comments on some shortcomings and merits of select contributions.

Chapters 1 and 2 focus on the metaphysics of agency. They stand out, among the wider collection, as addressing agency simpliciter. Chapter 1 concerns a certain class of actions, whereas Chapter 2 concerns the broad class of agents.

In "The Argument from Slips" (Ch. 1), Santiago Amaya outlines what he takes to be a particularly illuminating type of actions, what he calls 'slips.' Slips are "actions contrary to a governing intention . . . although you wind up not acting as intended . . . the intention sustains what you do" (19). Slips are taken to be distinct from paradigmatic cases of causal deviance. Rather, they are mistakes committed by agents, who if observed in action would appear to be acting competently and are unaware, for at least some duration, that they are acting contrary to their intention. Amaya takes slips to be actional illusions structurally analogous to perceptual illusions. Amaya then claims that particular noncausalists about action cannot offer a satisfactory explanation of slips.

Amaya's contribution makes some insightful connections between philosophy of perception and philosophy of action and pushes a new kind of challenge to noncausalism. It's not clear, however, whether Amaya should take slips to be unintentional. Although he asserts that such actions are not intentional, he also is committed to such actions being initiated and sustained by a suitably related intention (e.g., an intention to drive home sustains your driving the route to your old house).

In "A Gradualist Metaphysics of Agency" (Ch. 2), Jesús H. Aguilar and Andrei Buckareff propose an account of what it takes to be an agent. The notable feature of this account, which Aguilar and Buckareff are keen to emphasize, is that agency, whether human, animal, or otherwise, comes in degrees. Along this spectrum, they distinguish three groups of agents: quasi-agents, agents, and rational agents. In order to be considered a quasi-agent, something must possess causal powers. Full-blown agents must not only possess causal powers but also a kind of complexity and intentionality of mental states. Rational agents add to these conditions "responsiveness to an array of reasons, under the description of normative" (p. 36) in that such agents can be held accountable for conduct. So while non-human animals are agents on this view, only humans are rational agents.

This chapter is a valuable contribution, not least because the paper is the only one to tackle issues of nonhuman agency. Friends of "bottom-up" approaches to agency and those whose work in action theory is committed to naturalism will find discussion of interest here. A potential challenge to any such account still need to be addressed, however: Aguilar and Buckareff state that the difference between agents and rational agents is "one of complexity and not a difference of kind . . . where the more sophisticated ones attain their sophistication by being capable of acting for a wider range of reasons" (37). However, given that there is a difference in kind between the reasons to which agents are capable of responding and rational agents are capable of responding, the claim that this is a difference in degree needs some further defense.

Ch. 3 and 4 concern conditions for free agency.

In the epically-titled "Crossing a Mesh-Theory with a Reasons-Responsive Theory: Unholy Spawn of an Impending Apocalypse or Love Child of a New Dawn?" (Ch. 3), Michael McKenna and Chad Van Schoelandt outline a hybrid theory of free action. In their proposal, McKenna and Van Schoelandt take on board aspects of both mesh theories and reasons-responsive theories to yield answers to objections to each kind of theory. The advantage of mesh theories, according to McKenna and Van Schoelandt, is that they are "inwardly directed", capturing some important truths about a free agent's psychology, while the advantage of reasons-responsive theories is that they are "outwardly directed", better capturing the extension of free actions.

One of the merits of the proposed hybrid account is its neutrality with regard to compatibilism. The hybrid account is a novel one, and an unlikely marriage at that, which may be a nice blueprint for the start of some further modified accounts of free will. This unlikely marriage, however, brings with it a potential complication: Although McKenna and Van Schoelandt do devote space to exploring the limitations of combining the two approaches, a conflict between relevant historical features of (at least some) reasons-responsive theories and relevant time-slice only features of (at least some) mesh theories is not addressed.

In "Classical Compatibilism and Temporal Ontology" (Ch. 4), Pablo Rychter outlines and responds to one objection regarding the compatibility of Humean compatibilism and eternalism, the view that like the present the past and future exist and are equally real. The Humean about laws of nature may seem to have an advantage over the compatibilist who holds to necessitarian laws in answering how an agent can have the ability to do otherwise. If eternalism is correct, though, one might ask the following: if your future actions are already settled, then how can it be up to you what you will do? Rychter draws on the fact that the block representing the past and present is, metaphysically speaking, compatible with other continuations to reply on the Humean compatibilist's behalf. Rychter further argues, however, that Humean compatibilists would find it difficult to square their view with other accounts of the nature of time, such as presentism (e.g., given the truth-maker problem for presentists). This latter aspect is, alas, not pursued at length.

Chapters 5 through 8 concern issues of luck, metaphysical or otherwise; hence this section continues its focus on agential control, even in papers dealing with moral luck.

In "Reasons and Freedom" (Ch. 5), Carlos Moya gives a libertarian defense against the luck objection. He focuses his efforts on versions of the luck objection to libertarianism that claim that undetermined decisions and actions are arbitrary and hence are irrational. Moya draws upon the distinction between the weighing versus weighting reasons accounts of deliberation and argues that deliberation involves the weighting of reasons via second-order reasons. This process, he argues, is rational.

It is not obvious that this response to the cited luck objection could generalize to cover all versions of the objection. Although some proponents frame the objection in terms of whether decisions and actions can be rational if undetermined, some influential versions appeal instead to cross-world differences, contrastive explanations, or unfairness of punishing. Those interested in these versions of the luck objection can find expression of these versions and some responses in the next chapter (Ch. 6).

In "On the Luck Objection to Libertarianism" (Ch. 6), David Widerker and Ira M. Schnall survey some recent and influential versions of the luck argument and defend libertarianism about free will -- at least noncausal libertarianism. Appealing to our agentive experience of exercising (what seems to us to be) active and direct control, Widerker and Schnall argue that some of the most recent versions of the luck objection betray a misunderstanding of the libertarian position. Beyond this defense, they elucidate some worries for operative assumptions in certain versions of the luck objection (e.g., a conceptual link between lack of explanation and lack of control).

In "Moral Luck and True Desert" (Ch. 7), Sergi Rosell tackles moral luck. He argues that some kinds of moral luck, especially situational, formative, and constitutive, cannot easily be argued to be merely apparent luck due to worries about practical applicability and the nature of essential true desert.

Given the kinds of moral luck that emerge unscathed (at least according to Rosell), important questions follow for the implications for responsible agency. He states that one may take his argument as grounds for moral responsibility skepticism but mentions in passing that alternative notions of genuine moral responsibility are available to justify our practices. It would have been interesting to see more engagement here. Those with an interest in denial of moral luck and the notion of essential true moral desert will also find much in the way of critical comments in this chapter.

In "A New Form of Moral Luck?" (Ch. 8), Carolina Sartorio draws motivation from three prima facie disparate cases from legal studies. Sartorio argues that the presence of other agents can intuitively mitigate or eliminate an agent's moral responsibility for an action. For instance, one puzzle at issue is that our own intuitions push back against the assumption that differences in agential responsibility are grounded in differences in the agent's causal role.

Sartorio's contribution is a fruitful place for those interested in manipulation, especially free will theorists looking to ascertain what role, if any, manipulators play in driving intuitions in manipulation arguments. The third set of cases that she considers involves degrees of moral responsibility and as such is an important puzzle for theories of degrees of responsibility to address. Overall, the cases are suggestive of further external features of a scenario that bear upon responsibility.

Chapters 9 through 13 concern related issues of moral responsibility, especially requirements for moral responsibility and obligation and justification of blame. Chapters 14 through 16 discuss topics of responsibility in the context of broader interpersonal relationships and society.

In "Helping It" (Ch. 9), Helen Steward addresses the control condition for blameworthiness, proposing the "can't help it" or "couldn't help it" locution as a novel expression of the loss of control that excuses agents from blame. She further argues that "couldn't help it", colloquial in origin, cannot be captured in terms of the Principle of Alternate Possibilities or other control conditions for responsibility. She surveys cases from the literature on control, ranging from Frankfurt-style examples to involuntary sins and unintentional omissions, to argue that contra others' proposals, such agents do meet a weaker control condition, the couldn't help it condition.

This proposal is noteworthy in that it has the potential to break new ground on old and broad conundrums. Indeed there does seem to be a weaker sense in which agents in these cases had it in their power at some relevant time to perform a relevant action but didn't. More details need to be supplied, however. Steward admits that "the 'could have helped it' condition is comparatively weak" (p. 161), which, to my mind, leads to the challenge that such a condition may set the bar too low for a condition of blameworthiness. Depending on what one takes an agent's being blameworthy to entail, one could reasonably worry about insufficient justification if we adopt 'could have helped it' as the relevant control condition.

Out of all of the chapters that address the Ought Implies Can Principle, in "Ought without Ability" (Ch. 10) Carlos Patarroyo makes the principle his central focus. Patarroyo argues that there is a moral sense of ought that is agent-binding even if the agent lacks the ability to conform. Patarroyo incorporates discussion of the role of the Ought Implies Can Principle in arguments regarding moral responsibility. Motivating his account with insightful real-life cases, he suggests that a function of such agent-binding oughts may be of moral edification, cultivating in us appropriate feelings toward others and recognition of our moral obligations.

The examples cited, individuals in violent and war-torn settings, who feel certain that they have obligations to forgive despite knowing they cannot, are striking. A fuller discussion of these individuals might have built a stronger case. For instance, are these genuinely agent-binding obligations? Perhaps there is a prima facie obligation to forgive which is defeated in these trying circumstances. Regardless, the chapter contributes usefully to the functions of moral prescriptions in a distinctive way.

In "Omissions and Different Senses of Moral Responsibility" (Ch. 11), Derk Pereboom objects to proposed asymmetries in accounts of responsibility for actions and for omissions, wielding distinctions among senses of responsibility as support. Pereboom critically examines conditions of responsibility for outcomes. Echoing chapters 7 and 8, he brings to bear the control-undermining and hence desert-undermining feature of resultant moral luck. He argues that agents satisfy a wide range of non-desert entailing senses of moral responsibility in the kinds of cases under consideration in the responsibility for omissions debate. Similar to Steward's claims in chapter 9, Pereboom considers explanations of failures of vigilance with regard to some problematic cases of responsibility for outcomes.

This chapter contributes a clear, clean exposition of senses of moral responsibility and helpfully calls on us to keep these senses in mind when assessing the responsibility of agents in contentious cases at the heart of debates over, e.g., responsibility for omissions. Insofar as the senses are conflated or underspecified in those debates, disputants risk talking past one another.

Chapters 12 and 13 constitute a criticism and response to McKenna's argument against moral responsibility skepticism. The back and forth is a continuation of an argument against moral responsibility skepticism put forth by McKenna in his 2012 book Conversation and Responsibility; in that work McKenna attempts to disentangle justification for blame from justification for punishment. Even if punishment cannot be justified, he argued, we still may be justified in blaming others, and if we are so justified, then we ought not accept full-blown moral responsibility skepticism. Hence, much is at stake for the moral responsibility skeptic in this debate.

In "Moral Responsibility Skepticism: Meeting McKenna's Challenge" (Ch. 12), Neil Levy, qua skeptic, argues that the harm inflicted by blaming is more serious than McKenna allows. Given that both disputants concede that blaming can lead to emotional distress, Levy cites relevant empirical work on the parallels between emotional and physical pain to suggest that blaming can and sometimes does involve the same ills as punishment. He further contends that some forms of blame can be worse than some forms of punishment.

One needn't embrace moral responsibility skepticism wholesale to gain the potential implication of this chapter that perhaps justifications for blame and punishment shouldn't be offered according to such broad categories. Rather, in my view, this chapter insightfully presents the case for potential modifications to at least some of our moral and legal responsibility practices given the degree of harm of any particular practice.

In his brief "In Defense of a Challenge to Moral Responsibility Skepticism: A Reply to Levy" (Ch. 13), McKenna outlines his original aims in challenging the moral responsibility skeptic. McKenna does not take himself to be giving a knockdown argument. His challenge stems from the observation that the practices regarding agent's bad conduct that skeptics have endorsed are the same as those practices a non-skeptic defends under the label "blaming."

The rich conversation between the two authors evokes a fruitful discussion of whether blame can be noninstrumentally good and whether there are grounds for making a distinction between justifications for blame versus for punishment. These points are likely to be of interest more broadly than to just those who are familiar with McKenna's challenge to moral skepticism.

In "Motivated by the Gods: Compartmentalized Agency and Responsibility" (Ch. 14), Constantine Sandis offers an account of ownership and identification conditions for action, which diverges from other accounts on the market (e.g., Harry Frankfurt's and John Fischer and Mark Ravizza's). He is particularly concerned with a species of action contrary to desire or intention, and actions for which the agent lacks knowledge such that the action is not intentional (at least under a certain description). Sandis argues that an agent ought to recognize as hers, in an ownership sense, such actions and psychic items, rather than regarding her actions and elements of her psychological economy as "alien." Here ownership does not entail endorsement or require higher-order desires, and the agent may not even be morally responsible for her action. Still, Sandis argues, certain reactive attitudes may still be appropriate in accompaniment with such ownership of one's agency.

Those who work on true self and mesh theories, as well as akratic action, will find discussion of interest here. The greatest value of the chapter, to my mind, lies in the rich analysis of characters from Greek tragedy, which offers an alternative set of cases from the usual suspects of Frankfurt's willing and unwilling addict.

In "Friendship, Freedom, and Special Obligations" (Ch. 15), Dana Kay Nelkin offers a novel connection between friendship and free will, which she calls the 'Special Obligations Connection', on which friendship entails special obligation, and special obligations entail free action (or at least certain kinds of abilities). She argues that the special obligations of friendship are moral in nature, and given that an agent's being held to a moral obligation requires a certain kind of ability to fulfill that obligation, friendship requires freedom-relevant abilities.

As in other contributions in the volume, here too the Ought Implies Can principle is at issue; in this case the principle is appealed to as a plausible plank in the argument that the special obligations of friendship require certain abilities. Nelkin's contribution will be of particular interest to those concerned with the debate regarding obligation skepticism and the sources of special obligations: Nelkin adjudicates the broader debate about consequentialist and competitor accounts of the obligations of friendship and also offers a sketch of a voluntarist approach to the obligations of friendship.

In the final chapter, "Skepticism about Autonomy and Responsibility as Educational Aims: What Next?" (Ch. 16), Ishtiyaque Haji and Stefaan E. Cuypers marshal work from educational theory to describe how cultivating autonomous and responsible agents, agents who are aware of options (e.g. vocationally), is a pervasive goal in education. Drawing on the moral responsibility skeptics' toolkit, they list the well-known challenges for justifying moral treatment and conclude that, given these challenges, society ought to train children to take themselves to be autonomous and responsible. They argue that because it is often the case that agents cannot do otherwise, in the sense required for free will and responsibility, "education should not aim to attain what is largely beyond reach" (p. 251), qualifying as autonomous agents. Haji and Cuypers contend, however, that some related pedagogical aims, such as educating children to be critical thinkers, are not threatened if agents lack an ability to do otherwise.

It is noteworthy that Haji and Cuypers use cases of morally good actions, such as a mother saving her drowning child, to support that agents often cannot act otherwise intentionally. This is striking, as several theorists, including Nelkin in the previous chapter, are committed to an asymmetry in responsibility for actions: agents needn't have the ability to do otherwise to deserve praise, but agents must be able to do otherwise to deserve blame. Hence, a discussion of blameworthy agents might have been more productive dialectically. Overall, though, the chapter contributes to what ought to be a thriving enterprise in philosophy -- and not just in psychology -- on the limits of young agents' control capacities and implications for educational policies and practice.

In general, this anthology revisits, with a fresh perspective, a broad array of foundational issues in metaphysics of agency and ethics. As such, I recommend the book to action theorists and ethicists alike looking for new directions in theory.


McKenna, M. (2012). Conversation and Responsibility. New York: Oxford University Press.