Albert Camus: From the Absurd to Revolt

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John Foley, Albert Camus: From the Absurd to Revolt, McGill-Queen's UP, 2008, 256pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773534674.

Reviewed by Jason Herbeck, Boise State University



Googling conjointly the terms “Albert Camus” and “absurd” yields nearly two and a half million hits, whereas replacing the word “absurd” with “revolt” and running the search again reveals far fewer hits — only a little over one hundred thousand. As unscientific as the results of such a query may be, a fanciful surfer of the Web might well be led to at least one of two simple conclusions. Either Camus (1913-1960) is far better known for his ideas related to the absurd found in The Myth of Sisyphus (Le Mythe de Sisyphe, 1942) than to those involving revolt in The Rebel (L’Homme révolté, 1951), or — and perhaps not unrelatedly — despite the sheer magnitude and scope of the latter essay and the renowned falling out with Sartre that has in no small part been attributed to the stance taken by Camus in this second major philosophical work — Camus’s writings about and personal commitment to revolt remain far less appreciated and/or understood than those addressing the absurd. In either case, given the overwhelming difference in the number of hits, a third and perhaps more telling assumption might also be made — namely, that although the absurd is well-cited and frequently evoked in relation to Camus, it has not often been linked to the issue of revolt in Camus’s writing.

Google searches aside, John Foley’s book addresses what for all intents and purposes he perceives as the all-too-often misunderstood relationship between the absurd and revolt in Camus’s writings. Calling into question the critical contention made most recently by Avi Sagi and Richard Kamber, according to which Camus eventually rejected the absurd in favor of revolt, Foley proposes to demonstrate the “intellectual continuum” linking the two (4). Moreover, recognizing what he terms the “profound coherence between these two concepts” will, Foley argues, allow us to better negotiate the nuances of Camus’s political and philosophical engagements (170). Such a perspective is meant to afford readers a more informed understanding of the vexed issues, such as capital punishment, Algerian independence and the legitimacy of political violence, that Camus faced in his lifetime. Consequently, where Camus’s detractors (ranging from Sartre and de Beauvoir to Conor Cruise O’Brien and Edward Said) have leveled charges of political quietism and inconsequence, bourgeois liberalism and impotent idealism, Foley’s close critical readings and extensive scholarship provide an apologia of sorts for what some have too hastily interpreted as Camus’s egregious contradictions and inexcusable silence.

The book is divided into six chapters, not including the introduction and conclusion. Chapter 1 begins with an examination of the absurd as introduced and developed by Camus in The Myth of Sisyphus, and then follows with discussions of The Outsider (L’Étranger, published in the U.S. as The Stranger) and Caligula. In the first part of the chapter, Foley is particularly interested is distinguishing Camus’s description of the absurd from the Christian existentialist tradition of Kierkegaard, Jaspers and Chestov. Because belief in God provides these thinkers the means necessary to surmount the absurd, Camus labels their resulting “leap of faith” a “philosophical suicide”. Neither the world nor humans are absurd; rather, it is from their relationship that the absurd arises. Consequently, because the world resists the intelligibility sought by humans, the condition of the absurd cannot be overcome. According to Camus, the realization of the absurd should therefore be understood as a starting point from which the conscious individual must confront the “radical incoherence perceived to be at the heart of the relationship between the self and the world” (7). Foley subsequently argues that, for Camus, the absurd “is fundamentally an epistemological claim addressing an ontological need” and that, “From this premise, Camus progressively extends the absurd perspective to a critique of all transcendental truths or values” (8).

It is with respect to this precise starting point — namely, Camus’s subsequent investigation as to whether or not it is possible to respond positively to the absurd — that Foley introduces the crucial issue of limits that reappears in The Rebel and moreover, he claims, constitutes the continuum of Camus’s political and philosophical thought. Along these lines, Foley then turns to The Stranger and Caligula, asserting that the absurd as expressed by Camus is neither an inflexible prelude to nihilism (as demonstrated by Cherea in Caligula) nor a predetermined path to “infinite” hope — a concept that Foley introduces as synonymous with Kierkegaardian philosophical suicide and that in his reading is duly challenged in The Stranger by the absurd hero par excellence, Meursault, whose “exemplary honesty” stands out in “a world bereft of transcendent meaning” (14, 17).

In the final part of the chapter, Foley chooses to differentiate between what he calls “infinite” hope and “finite” hope, defining the latter term as “a mundane hope in an unsponsored universe” (27). It is somewhat unclear to this reader why Foley would opt for what appears to be an unnecessarily laborious and confusing term in order to identify what Camus clearly designates otherwise in the essay. After all, in announcing the necessary negotiation between these two absolutes — suicide (nihilism) and the leap of faith (religious hope) — in The Myth of Sisyphus, Camus asserts:

Living is keeping the absurd alive. Keeping it alive is, above all, contemplating it. Unlike Eurydice, the absurd dies only when we turn away from it. One of the only coherent philosophical positions is thus revolt. It is a constant confrontation between man and his own obscurity. It is an insistence upon an impossible transparency (54, my emphasis).1

Thus Foley elects to substitute a somewhat convoluted term for one that, ironically, is at the focal point of his discussion. This is perhaps due to the fact that the fact that Foley also suggests that the revolt at issue here is “an acceptance [of the fact of the absurd] filled with scorn, defiance and suffering” and that “we are still not clear on how we can move from the image of the solitary rebel to the concept of solidarity, which is necessary for revolt to have any political or social significance” (10, 11). What allows Foley to “rescue Sisyphus from his solipsistic exile” is reaffirming the absurd as “a methodological deconstruction of commonplace assumptions, including those regarding morality and politics” (13). However, given that revolt figures prominently — along with freedom and passion — as one of three acceptable consequences of the absurd, it would seem only logical to indicate this more clearly in order not only to better address those that have found the two terms mutually exclusive and/or contradictory for Camus, but to illustrate the very continuum of Camus’s thought that Foley wishes to demonstrate. Introducing “finite” hope into the equation seems to unduly blur the consequences of the absurd and the subsequent evolution of meaning that the term ‘revolt’ would undergo in Camus’s mind and works.

Camus scholars have often singled out Cherea and others’ eventual uprising against Caligula and his nihilist tendencies in the eponymous play as early evidence of (collective) rebellion in Camus’s works. However, what stands out in Foley’s assessment of Camus’s self-described “trilogy of the absurd” are the prevalent undertones of solidarity that he attributes to both The Stranger and The Myth of Sisyphus. Interpreting Meursault’s situation as that of a sincere man sentenced to death by the French judicial system for his brutal honesty (i.e., for essentially refusing to lie about his feelings), Foley rebuts what he terms the “ethic of indifference” that critics have used in describing the novel. Instead, he casts The Stranger quite to the contrary as “a plea for the rights of the individual against social conformity and against the state” (22). Similarly, he calls into question the solipsistic nature of Sisyphus’s happiness, suggesting that Camus’s own personal commitments at the time — such as joining the French Resistance in 1943 and becoming editor-in-chief of the clandestine Resistance newspaper Combat — allow for Sisyphus’s revolt against the gods to “be [clearly] read as a first definitive step towards a more general conception of political and social commitment and resistance” (14). Such readings are intriguing to say the least but would ultimately prove more convincing if supported with further textual analysis and discussion.

Entitled "Camus and Combat", Chapter 2 examines Camus’s political writing during the period separating the respective publications of The Myth of Sisyphus and The Rebel. Returning to the fundamental issue of limits and absolutes first evoked in the former of the two essays, Foley objects to the mutual exclusiveness often attributed to morality and politics when evaluating Camus’s political commitments and, in so doing, champions the image of Camus as a both actively and politically engaged writer. Detailed analysis of Camus’s four Letters to a German Friend (1944-45) as well as numerous articles written for Combat (1944-47) and those comprising “Neither Victims nor Executioners” (1946) serve to illustrate Camus’s ongoing commitment to politics. In particular, Foley astutely demonstrates through close textual analysis the extent to which these writings address the very “starting point” of the absurd as determined by Camus in The Myth of Sisyphus. Letters to a German Friend reveals, for instance, his search to create an ameliorative ethic based on human solidarity as opposed to the absolutist transcendent ethic characterized by hatred and moral cynicism to which the fictional ally of the Nazis is understood to adhere. Highlighted pages of Combat recount in detail Camus’s own changing positions while searching for a sound ethic. For example, while initially supporting the execution of Pierre Pechu, a minister in the collaborationist Vichy government, Camus took less than a year to radically change his view of the purge and to advocate alongside François Mauriac for a morally conscientious politics. The inevitable immorality of politics raised by Maurice Merleau-Ponty’s 1946 “Le Yogi et le Prolétaire” (later published under the title Humanism and Terror) prompted Camus to write a series of responses collectively titled “Neither Victims nor Executioners” that, in challenging the supposedly utopian conception of Marxism and Merleau-Ponty’s “logic of History”, clearly sets the tone and theme for The Rebel.

The third chapter focuses in its entirety on The Rebel. Consistent with his overarching thesis, Foley is quick to demonstrate that "Camus neither refutes nor revises the positing of the absurd found in The Myth of Sisyphus" (56). After all, it is soon averred by Camus that awareness of the absurd in no way precludes concern for political violence. Quite the contrary, given the necessity of human life in order for the absurd to exist, the absurd condition is essentially equivalent to the human condition, thereby rendering life good for all men. Following a brief discussion of metaphysical rebellion and historical rebellion, Foley turns to Camus’s handling of Hegel and Marx. Whereas Camus judged Hegel negatively for having reduced reason to history, and in so doing endowing reason with a lack of moderation (mesure), he views Marxism with an equally critical eye due to what he perceives as its historical determinism. Finding fault with the absolute as opposed to relative values that serve to orient each way of thinking, Camus suggests that rebellion should necessarily entail a “philosophy of limits” whereby, as Foley states, “political actions and doctrines are legitimate to the extent to which they refute absolutism and reflect the needs of individuals and communities in relation to their own particular political, social and economic circumstances” (79). In deftly articulating Camus’s position with respect to moderation, Foley fleshes out why so many critics have (wrongly, as it were) misinterpreted his philosophy of limits as political inconsequence. Just as importantly, it is made clear in Foley’s analysis to what extent Camus himself was aware of and addressed the criticisms that the ambiguous criteria of such a rebellion would undoubtedly incur.

Chapter 4 addresses “Camus and Political Violence” by first examining the “scrupulous assassins” of the Russian Socialist Revolutionary Party (as discussed in The Rebel and portrayed in The Just Assassins) and then turning to “Reflections on the Guillotine”. At the heart of the chapter — and ultimately at the heart of each of the major crises Camus was to face in the years to come — is the dilemma concerning legitimate political violence. Of particular note is the list Foley compiles of what he takes to be the necessary conditions to be met in order for an act of killing to be deemed permissible by Camus, as evidenced in The Just Assassins (Les Justes) and Caligula. Stating these conditions as clearly as possible not only serves to demonstrate that Camus was not a “reluctant pacifist” as some critics have long contended, but that the criteria upon which he founded the justification of such violence were incontrovertibly and intentionally ambiguous. The acceptance of limits and the obligation to recognize fallibility led Camus to be wary of individuals or states that proclaim absolute objectivity and explain his eventual determination that capital punishment is unjustifiable.

Chapter 5, “Camus and Sartre”, examines the diverging perspectives of the two men, including a comparative list of conditions deemed necessary to legitimize terror according to Sartre and a discussion of what having dirty hands (or clean ones) meant to each man in the context of political violence. Having done a close reading Francis Jeanson’s and Sartre’s responses to The Rebel, Foley proposes that the differences between Sartre and Camus, while perhaps muffled to some extent for various reasons prior to the publication of The Rebel, can be traced back to fundamental differences in their respective positions on the absurd:

what began as a critique of a book and its author’s precious defence against its detractors becomes a profound and scathing critique of a writer’s entire œuvre. What Sartre sets out to prove is that, given Camus’s absurd premise, his work inevitably evolved towards a kind of critical entropy that culminated in the profoundly ahistorical and reactionary work that was The Rebel (118).

Accused of having taken on the persona of the Hegelian “beautiful soul” (belle âme) who “prefers to remain pure, uncontaminated by contact with reality”, Camus is judged to lack effective political thought on the basis of his clinging to abstract ideas (112). Foley counters at length, however, that both Jeanson and Sartre fail to address the main argument of The Rebel — namely, Camus’s critical discussion of Marxist historicism — and claims that for them to do so would have invalidated or at the very least contradicted the "prevailing existentialism of Les Temps modernes" for which both men wrote (114).

In the final chapter, “Camus and Algeria”, Foley renews his defense of Camus’s political agenda and engagement, describing at length the many instances in which he spoke out to voice his dismay and horror with respect to the violence around him and to suggest peaceful resolutions to Franco-Algerian conflict. Foley shows how Camus’s idea of a “Mediterranean humanism”, present in its early forms as early as 1937, are rearticulated in la pensée de midi at the end of The Rebel in 1951. Furthermore, he challenges postcolonial critics of Camus such as O’Brien and Said who, Foley asserts, in addition to the textual selectivity and/or reductiveness of their methodology, should also be taken to task on account of their anachronistic slant. Such a perspective is inherently flawed, Foley argues, because “its criticism of Camus’s failure to support Algerian independence is derived, in part, from the fact of Algerian independence after 1962” (147). Citing two of Camus’s contemporaries in the struggle for Algerian independence, Amar Ouzegane and Albert Memmi, Foley demonstrates that, far from “silent” with respect to the French-Algeria question, Camus was in fact quite vocal from the start and to some extent predicted the subsequent gravity of the escalating conflict as early as 1945, when he lamented the incoherence of French colonial policy and “insisted upon the need to recognize the fact of a political crisis in Algeria” (152).

When Foley goes on to draw from the series of articles that Camus published in Combat subsequent to World War II (on the mass murders by the French army of thousands of Muslims at Sétif and Guelma, and Camus’s own 1,500-mile trip around Algeria) it indeed seems hard to believe that postcolonial critiques such as those of O’Brien and Said were ever taken seriously. Evoking the underlying political problem of an Algerian policy “distorted by prejudice and ignorance”, Camus remained highly critical of the hypocritical way in which post-World War II France continued to treat the Muslim population. It was crucial for him that French government policy not respond “with condemnations, [but rather] try to understand the reasons for their demands and invoke on their behalf the same democratic principles that we claim for ourselves” (151). It is perhaps Camus’s inability to change the charged climate of the times, however, that ultimately allows criticism relative to his “inaction” or “silence” to endure to this day. In addressing this issue, Foley comes full circle in his book by tying his discussion of Camus and Algeria to the absurd and revolt by way of Camus’s “most significant intervention in the conflict”, the trêve civil or civilian truce, according to which Camus advocated that all sides agree not to harm the civilian population, regardless of circumstances.

Foley’s book can be read in some ways as how Camus evidently intended The Rebel to be read. Camus proposed “words of courage and intelligence” in the face of what he perceived to be the murderous, contradictory ideologies of the modern era, Foley has written a well-documented investigation of Camus’s writings in order to elucidate and defend what some — namely, Camus’s biggest critics — contend amounts only to ineffectual political idealism and/or quietism regarding the aforementioned topics. That said, I found the individual chapters far stronger overall than the over-riding argument of the book. On the one hand, I would not hesitate to assign chapters 4, 5 and 6 individually in my course on Camus, since they are well documented and provide clear, convincing and often original assessments that easily stand on their own. On the other hand, Foley’s at times cursory attention to literary works to corroborate points made elsewhere, combined with what could be a considerably more thorough discussion as to how and why he feels we must attribute political and/or social significance to (the meaning of) revolt in The Myth of Sisyphus, render the basis of the “intellectual continuum” argument a bit difficult to follow. Notwithstanding, as the fiftieth anniversary of Camus’s death and the hundredth anniversary of his birth approach (2010 and 2013, respectively), Foley’s book is well placed among recent contributions to Camus scholarship to further our understanding of how indisputably relevant and valuable Camus’s thought and commitments are today.

1 Camus, Albert. The Myth of Sisyphus and Other Essays. Trans. Justin O’Brien. New York: Vintage International, 1991.