Alcibiades and the Socratic Lover-Educator

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Marguerite Johnson and Harold Tarrant (eds.), Alcibiades and the Socratic Lover-Educator, Bloomsbury, 2012, 272pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780715640869.

Reviewed by Sara Ahbel-Rappe, University of Michigan


Again, do we not read how Socrates was stigmatized by the 'physiognomist' Zopyrus, who professed to discover men's entire characters and natures from their body, eyes, face and brow? He said that Socrates was stupid and thick-witted because he had not got hollows in the neck above the collarbone -- he used to say that these portions of his anatomy were blocked and stopped up; he also added that he was addicted to women -- at which Alcibiades is said to have given a loud guffaw! (Cicero, De Fato, Chapter 10 (Rackham translation))

This bit of Alcibiades lore is related in one of two dialogues attributed to Phaedo of Elis, a member of the Socratic circle and most famously the companion portrayed in Plato's eponymous dialogue. It suggests how popular Alcibiades-Socrates gossip proved to be in the fourth century, a popularity further attested by the sheer number of Platonic, pseudo-Platonic, and extra-Platonic dialogues that treat this relationship, arguably one of the most notorious love stories in Ancient Greek literature. These dialogues include, of course, the Symposium and Protagoras, but also Alcibiades II, Aeschines' Alcibiades, Phaedo's Zopyrus, and the [Pseudo?-] Platonic Alcibiades I.

This edited volume is based on a conference held at the University of Newcastle (Australia) in 2008 on the topic of Alcibiades I (henceforth AI ).The fourteen papers and two appendices range temporally and even geographically in their approaches, from Harold Tarrant's stellar historical and linguistic research into the dating of AI to a "rain on your parade" essay by Fergus King highlighting the repudiation of the lover-educator model in Philo of Alexandria (with the chilling title, "Ice-cold in Alex"). But the papers share a Classical Studies orientation to the dialogue, as distinct from the methods of analytic philosophy. They tend to be placed in the volume according to a chronological scheme, from the archaic to the modern period. 

The first essay, by the co-editor Marguerite Johnson, scales AI and Socratic eros more generally alongside the priamels of Sappho, showing that the criterion for choice of love object can be in itself a spur to philosophy: why this particular individual? Is the individual beloved because she is loved, or rather is she loved because she is loveable? Socrates' transmission of erotic instruction, like Sappho's, is performative, because he himself is subject to eros. In stark contrast to Johnson, Dougal Blyth wants to claim that Socrates, by virtue of his expertise in erotic matters, is not a lover of young men -- not even of their souls. Socrates' claim to erotic expertise implies that he has been initiated into the highest possible degree of erotic mystery and so is now irrevocably and only a lover of the form of beauty, which is not and cannot be located in individuals. Hence, he remains impervious to the charms of young men; he rather uses the trappings of conventional love to disguise his true purpose, which is always and only philosophy.

Arguing by way of a different route but ending up at the same conclusion, Victoria Wohl  joins Blyth in arguing that Socratic eros involves very little in the way of falling for young men. According to the AI's erotic optics, one of the pair looks into the eyes of the other member and sees himself: eros operates as self-projection. Hence the other is necessarily occluded from view. But what of the self-knowledge seemingly on offer in the AI? When the lover gazes into the eye of the beloved he does find not his true self, rather he worships a god made in his own image, an idolatrous usurpation of the genuinely optical operations in the love relationship, which are (maybe surprisingly) better found in Xenophon. There, the beloved takes in and assimilates the image of the lover and so becomes more like the lover through imitation.

Reuben Ramsey treats Plato's embarrassment over the problem of Alcibiades: how could Socrates go for a guy like that and, more alarmingly, why didn't he do something about Alcibiades before it was too late? Ramsey argues that the Protagoras and Gorgias obliquely address the odd combination of Socrates' mentorship and Alcibiades's moral failings. In these works Plato groups Alcibiades together with Critias as part of a larger class of criminally minded demagogues, or as only serving as a reflex of the larger impetus toward imperialism that was ultimately born in the ambitions of those who were more reputable, as for example, Pericles. In other words, Alcibiades took the fall for the missteps of an entire era.

Yugi Kurihara, in "Socratic Ignorance",highlights the disavowal of knowledge, comparing the Apology's formula, "I don't think I know (Ap. 21d6) " with the AI's alternative formula, "whoever knows he doesn't know." (117a5-d6) Not thinking one knows is a condition of self-knowledge; moreover, as one is not falsely conceited, there is room to acquire the knowledge that he lacks. Not so in the AI, where Socrates insists that one must know that he does not know. But knowing you don't know is a contradiction, and what's worse, the remedy for knowing you don't know, in theAI, at least, is to enlist the help of an expert, someone who really does know. At this point, when we entrust our affairs to an expert, we can kiss Socratic philosophy goodbye. Kurihara concludes that AI is not likely to be by Plato.

In "Did Alcibiades Learn Justice from the Many?",Joe Mintoff works with the Great Speech of the Protagoras, along with other resources, tries to help Alcibiades defend his assertion that he learns justice from "people in general," (AI 110E 2-3). Here Alcibiades invokes the democratic ideology that Socrates in AI and elsewhere (Ap 25b) rejects, to the effect that the many, just as they serve as competent teachers of Greek, also serve as competent teachers of virtue. The many can't teach virtue, Socrates argues, since disagreement characterizes those who do not know; experts tend to agree. But the many disagree with each other; therefore, they don't make good teachers. Mintoff explores the soundness of this thesis by discussing the idea of expert disagreement.

Anthony Hooper elaborates the model of eros and antieros adumbrated in the Phaedrus, suggesting that it is structured like rational activity. Philosophical conversation involves mutual care of the interlocutors for each other's souls, as well as a concern with virtue, so dialectic forms a model for the reciprocal love toward which Socrates aspires in his relationship with Alcibiades (in both theSymposium and AI) but which he ultimately fails to obtain, owing to Alcibiades' obstructive attachments. Eugenio Benitez makes an attempt to defend AI's possible authenticity despite its doctrinal inconsistency with what another scholar has called "secure knowledge" about Socratic philosophy in the elenctic dialogues, including that it is committed to the unity of virtue, equivalent to knowledge of the good. Again according to what are essentially developmentalist arguments, the situation changes in the Republic, for example, where courage is the function of the spirited part of the soul in aligning itself with the pronouncements of the intellect (R 429b), and justice is the agreement among all the parts about which part is to rule. When we look at how the AI stands on the unity of the virtues, we find first that courage seems not to be a virtue at all, since Socrates demonstrates that it is not an unqualified good, while justice is unqualifiedly good. Scratch unity of virtue off the list for AI. Yes, AI offers a more complicated account of courage than we find in the elenctic dialogues, but that only makes it inconsistent with them, and not necessarily spurious.

Matthew Sharpe offers a study of Alcibiades II, a dialogue often seen as written by one of Plato's inferior imitators. In the past it has suffered from a lack of philosophical attention. Among the many interesting features of the essay, Sharpe shows how Alcibiades II reads like a tragedy, meditating on both aphrosune (madness), construed as active desire for what is harmful, and megalopsuchia (great-souledness). Sharpe argues that the author wants to indicate that political ambition, whose crowning virtue is megalopsuchia, is inherently tragic. The author of Alcibiades II thus appropriates this word for the negative column. Ultimately, Alcibiades' tragic ambition proved fatal for philosophy, as Socrates himself became the target of those seeking to improve the state and impugning the philosopher because of his ill-fated beloved.

Tarrant, in "Improvement by Love: From Aeschines to the Old Academy",discusses love as a "divine dispensation for the care of the youth," the definition of eros current in Polemo's early 3rdcentury Academy and quoted by Plutarch (Moralia 780d). Eros, considered as a divine appointment, has clear resonances in the Phaedrus, where the inspired lover attends to the beloved as in the train of his chosen deity; in AI, when Socrates' daimon allows him to approach Alcibiades; and also in Aeschine's Alcibiades, where we are told that Socrates sought to improve the younger man solely by means of love, through a divine dispensation (theia moira). Tarrant discusses the possible provenance of both AI and the Theages in Polemo's academy, where perhaps long association with, if not outright devotion to, a teacher was requisite for the transmission of the scholarchy.

In "Ice-Cold in Alex", King extinguishes the incendiary passions of the Hellenic type, the lover-educator, with the glacial precepts of Jewish law, on the one hand, and ethnic prejudice against effeminate Hellenes, on the other. The famous "Therapeutae" essay of Philo -- that anti-sympotic symposium, which is even more chaste than the Platonic original -- and the general condemnation of homosexuality on the grounds of effeminacy and childlessness in Philo's commentaries on the Jewish Law form the subject matter here.

Akitsuku Taki reviews the fifth-century scholarch Proclus's AI Commentary, offering Proclus's framework for a specifically Socratic reading of the elenctic dialogues that has applications for AI's subject matter, self-knowledge. Proclus understands the interlocutor as under examination by his own inner deity (intellect) in so far as the soul's activity of thinking through philosophical puzzles posed in the elenchus constitutes an opportunity for the projection (probole) of the logos previously latent in the soul. Therefore, the soul recollects its prenatal knowledge during the elenchus, and in this sense, Proclus' Commentary on AI is a kind of metacommentary on the whole of Socratic method. Socratic method then is equated to self-knowledge.

François Renaud treats Socrates' divine sign both as it manifests in AI and as it operates in other Socratic dialogues. He also touches on the late fifth century Platonist Olympiodorus's Commentary. Socrates' daimon, eros, is paradoxically unique to Socrates but also an exemplum, suggesting the correct way to love, which is to benefit and improve, to act with beneficence rather than selfishness. Ultimately, the divine sign equates with the divinely inspired lover. For Olympiodorus and other Neoplatonist commentators, divinity refers to intellect, which the individual soul must revert to or come to identify as. The lover then facilitates self-realization in the beloved. Again, this chapter reminds us that egoism is very far from the ancient configuration of Socrates and, indeed, of Socratic love. Neil Morpeth provides a diachronic survey of the Alcibiades persona, from ancient historical sources to modern dramatic adaptations. Morpeth queries what it means to be that kind of culturally constructed individual who is part literary device, part philosophical exemplum, part historical personage. The piece stands as a convincing reply to possible objections to the study of the AI in its historical and literary contexts. In the case of Alcibiades, philosophy and history interact on the stage of the collective psyche, trading in archetypes, individuals, stereotypes, and everything in between, for their always ramifying effects.

Two appendices are impressive technical investigations of the vexed question of AI's chronology and authenticity, and are admirable for being informative, unbiased, original investigations all at once. Appendix I, by Elizabeth Baynham and Tarrant, "Fourth-century Politics and the Date of the Alcibiades I," starts by reassuring us that "no fourth century BC date seems to be excluded" and even allows an early third century date. The essay ferrets out important contextual information, as for example, when Spartan wealth would exceed Athenian wealth, or the political situation of the island city-state, Peparethos. Possibly the dialogue alludes to Athens' failure to protect the island, its ally, from Alexander, tyrant of Pherae (Diodorus 15.93 and Polyanenus fr. 6.2). The essay calls attention as well to the parallels between the ambitions of the 20-year-old Alcibiades and those of the world-conquering Alexander the Great. It ends with two intriguing speculations, first that the dialogue belongs to a genre of fourth century sympotic literature, and second that the dialogue may be the repository of different historical layers, possibly developing (as, the authors suggest, the speeches in Plato's Symposium seem to do) as part of an oral tradition. We can now understand the flexibility of Baynham and Tarrant's account of the dialogue's provenance: as a late Platonic dialogue imitating the Socratic dialogues, as a document composed in Polemo's Academy, or as a mirror for princes, with Alcibiades the foil for Alexander the Great.

Appendix II, "Report on the Working Vocabulary of the Doubtful Dialogues," by Tarrant and Terrence Roberts, shows that the AI is not likely, at least on the criterion of vocabulary, to belong to early Plato. Yet, by thinking of the dialogue as "late" Plato, one would have to explain its affinities with, e.g., the Phaedo, as well as its divergences from the style of "late" Plato. Its more obvious stylistic affinities are with dialogues also found in Tetralogy VII and generally thought to be spurious, Alcibiades II and Hipparchus.

This collection, then, is aptly named, as the essays indeed discuss Alcibiades and the Socratic lover-educator. But how does it advance the study of Plato's philosophy, especially given the uncertainty, which the volume does nothing to resolve, concerning the authenticity of the AI? Perhaps the foremost consideration has to do with the picture AI provides of Socratic eros as fundamentally benevolent, seeking the good of the beloved for his own sake. AI presents the Socratic daimon as a god, and hence, following the principle of divine activity -- always and only to benefit -- reveals a Socratic eros that is anything but egoistic, selfish, or narcissistic. If we read the AI in this way, we come to see that modern scholars may be singularly out of touch with the ancient understanding of the meaning of Socratic eros, or even of Socratic ethics, both of which many moderns continue to construe as egoistic. In 1969, Vlastos (published 1973) delivered the following challenge: "that to love a person we must wish that person's good for that person's sake -- not for ours, is something Aristotle understands. Does Plato?" Vlastos answered with a decisive "no," and nearly forty years later we find Reshotko writing (2006: 58) "Socrates thinks that harm and benefit are always and only harm or benefit to the self."

But if AI is not genuine and if it suggests that eros is concerned with the well-being of the beloved for his own sake, then what import could it have on our understanding of Plato's Socrates? We might argue with Tarrant, Hooper, and Blyth that the Phaedrus' model of the inspired lover, who acts in accord with the beneficence of the divine (for Plato, everywhere, the god always does good and assimilates others as far as possible to this condition), is inherently altruistic. Or we might argue that the Socratic paradigm as it operated in the Socratic literature of Plato as well as in thespuria, from the Apology ("the Olympian victor makes you think yourself happy; I make you be happy." Ap 36e9) to Aeschines' Alcibiades, shows us a person supremely devoted to the well being of others. The lesson here could well be, "do as I do, not as I say." We can then contrast the so-called doctrine of eros in the Symposium, which does perhaps involve using the beloved as a means to enlightenment, with Socrates' life and loves.

At any rate, AI also raises the question: If harm and benefit are always and only harm or benefit to the self, then just what is this self? Shouldn't we aim to answer this question first? It's clear that Plato or whoever wrote AI at any rate thought so. Two of the essays, those of Tarrant and of Wohl, touch on this important question. Wohl's paper suggests that the very structure of erotic self-knowledge, wherein the lover comes to see himself in the eyes of the beloved, occludes knowledge of self or other. It seems surprising to me that Wohl understands AI according to this configuration, since Plato says that it is the beloved who comes to see himself in the eyes of the lover (133c) -- in this case, Socrates. Socrates is a mirror not only, as AI demonstrates, of the faults and vices of the beloved/interlocutor, but also, as Tarrant hints, of what other commentators have called the "theomorphic self" that appears in the person of Socrates. In our text[1] the best mirror for the soul is god: "the way that we can best see and know ourselves is to use the finest mirror available and look at God, and, on the human level, the virtue of the soul" (133c16-17). For late antique authors such as Olympiodorus and Proclus, Socrates represents the intellect, the most divine aspect of the human being. Plotinus in Ennead 1.1, "The animate and the man," reads AI as an abbreviated De anima, with Alcibiades himself exemplifying the "lower" soul: passions and appetites. Perhaps this late antique reading can help us make sense of the paradox of our love story: the most virtuous man that Plato had ever known fell in love with a traitor. After every attempt to rescue Alcibiades, including saving his very life at Delium, Socrates ends up taking the rap for an irremediable comrade. Yet if Socrates and Alcibiades represent that other mismatch, the irrational side of human nature and our better, enlightened selves, the romance seems one with which all mortals are acquainted. AI is truly a mirror for the soul.



Reshotko, N. 2006. Socratic Virtue: making the best of the neither good-nor-bad. Cambridge.

Vlastos, G. 1973. "The Individual as an Object of Love in Plato." In Platonic Studies (pp. 3-43). Princeton.

[1] The irony here is that this theomorphic self may or may not be part of the "original" text. If the text is not by Plato in the first place, ought we to continue to etherize these lines?