All or Nothing: Systematicity, Transcendental Arguments, and Skepticism in German Idealism

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Paul W. Franks, All or Nothing: Systematicity, Transcendental Arguments, and Skepticism in German Idealism, Harvard University Press, 2005, 452pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674018885

Reviewed by Brian O'Connor, University College Dublin


That philosophy should be a system was a requirement loudly demanded by a range of post-Kantian philosophers from Reinhold to Hegel. To later philosophers this requirement seemed to be little more than the peculiar fixation of a period of speculative philosophy entirely detached from reality, and the complex ways in which individual philosophers had attempted to meet it were surely too testing to be indulged. Furthermore the interests which stimulated the demand for systematicity -- responses largely to problems in Rationalism -- were, if anything, even more arcane. It was not the tradition of analytic philosophy alone that scorned the systematic requirement. Much of German philosophy from the radical thinkers of the nineteenth century to Phenomenology and Critical Theory was familiar with it and regarded it as a dangerous prejudice which diverted philosophers from experience and towards notorious introverted thought systems. It may be the case that these systematic constructions ought to be consigned, as Edmund Husserl assumed, to the museum of philosophical history. But before we do that the important question must be whether there is a philosophically viable way of making sense of the systematic requirement.

The central aim of Paul Franks' brilliant and highly stimulating book is to locate and analyze the sources of and arguments for the systematic requirement. Franks subjects the material to the highest standards of philosophical analysis during the course of which the philosophical virtues of this period are newly evident.

Franks proposes that we can understand the development of post-Rationalist philosophy, from Kant onwards, as the determined effort to avoid the Agrippan trilemma (8) of (i) setting out positions based on arbitrary assumptions, or being subject to either (ii) vicious circle or (iii) infinite regress. Unless the challenge of the trilemma was effectively met, as Franks shows, the threat of skepticism -- with its existential as well as philosophical dangers -- could not be answered. This issue fundamentally determined the distinctive further contributions of the German Idealists who adopted, from Rationalism, the idea of a systematic form of argument as a response to the trilemma.

Franks provides frameworks for understanding and evaluating the German Idealist concept of system, which although not expressed in the terminology of the German Idealists themselves nevertheless illuminate their projects in sympathetic ways. He identifies what he calls "derivation monism," "the view that, in an adequate philosophical system, the a priori conditions of experience must be derived from a single absolute first principle" (17). But this comes with a "dualistic demand" that "physical grounding and metaphysical grounding must be kept rigorously separate" (20). Franks also detects the operations of "holistic monism" with (i) its holistic requirement that "in an adequate philosophical system, empirical items must be such that their properties are determinable only within the context of a totality composed of other items and their properties" (85) and (ii) its monistic requirement that "in an adequate philosophical system, the absolute first principle must be immanent within the aforementioned totality, as its principle of totality" (85). And one further issue. Whatever we might propose as a single absolute first principle must fulfil what Franks calls the "heterogeneity requirement" (103), which means that it cannot be subject to the law of the series of which it is the first principle without falling back into the Agrippan trilemma or a version of Spinozistic determinism. In a truly impressive set of analyses, covering in significant detail Kant, Reinhold, Maimon, Mendelssohn, Schulze, and Fichte, Franks explores the various philosophical evolutions which emerged within these distinctive ideas of an holistic procedure.

A great deal can be learned from Franks' discussion (in Chapter 1) of the notion of the thing-in-itself, both in its role in Kant's transcendental idealism and in the manner of its rejection by post-Kantians. Franks ranges over, and compellingly dismisses, the "two methods interpretation" (associated most prominently with Henry Allison) of the relation of appearance and thing-in-itself on the grounds that it is not comprehensively consistent with Kant's text (40). The passages that exclude the "two methods" reading turn out, on Franks' sophisticated interpretation, to contain analytic commitments to the thing-in-itself (which we find in Kant's analysis of the very concept of appearance) and synthetic commitments which are stimulated by what he describes as "reason's demand for grounding [of phenomena] that terminates in an absolute" (46). Instead Franks proposes a "two essences interpretation" (48), which develops a position set out by Karl Ameriks and, it seems to me, also by Frederick Beiser. This view is based on the distinction between the transcendental and the empirical, which are to be understood as "two hierarchies of grounding" (50): "the transcendental hierarchy of grounding is appropriate to the in itself. The empirical grounding is appropriate to appearances" (50). This is a fascinating (though perhaps sketchy) alternative which responds both to the deficiency of the two methods interpretation and places Kant in context, in that the two essences interpretation is clearly marked by Leibniz's conception that there need to be two orders of grounding (50). Indeed one of the many valuable things in Franks' book is its keen awareness of the rationalistic conceptions of philosophical argument of which Kant was fully cognizant and which he did not entirely surrender in his critical period. Franks' interpretation is to be distinguished from the other options set out in Kant scholarship, the "two aspects interpretations" -- the thing-in-itself being the non-phenomenal "aspect" of the objects of experience -- and the "two existents interpretation" in which the in-itself is somehow an entity apart form the objects of the sensible world.

Curiously, however, Franks seems to back away from his own promising line of interpretation. In Chapter 3 he considers the allegation that Kant's delimitations of the conditions of knowledge -- leading to a dualism of the knowable and the thing-in-itself -- amounted to a new form of scepticism in spite of Kant's intentions, one which troubled the post-Kantians from Jacobi to Hegel. Franks argues that such an accusation rests on a mistaken belief about the nature of transcendental idealism and how it works the distinction between empirical realism and transcendental idealism. Surprisingly his argument here seems after all rather like the two aspects view. "Empirically speaking, to say that all objects of experience are mere representations is to make an ontological claim. It is to say that all objects of experience are mental" (159). And then, with an apparent two aspects interpretation, he writes: "If, however, one says that all objects of experience are representations in the transcendental sense, no such ontological claim is being made … Rather the claim in its transcendental sense is like the claim that an object has a certain property when viewed from a certain perspective" (159, italics added); "So the perspectival character of transcendental idealism is very different from the ontological character of empirical idealism" (160, italics added).

In Chapter 2 Franks proposes what he sees as the historically decisive move away from Kant, that is, the development of "post-Kantian monism." Kant was no monist in that, as Franks argues, he was in various ways committed to "Monadic Individualism: the thesis that properties can be instantiated only if they are borne by individuals, which possess some [not only] intrinsic properties" (86). Did the post-Kantians deny intrinsic properties and end up with the unreality of relations, a thesis derided by Russell? Franks explores the extraordinary revival of interest in Spinoza as the period's solution to the alleged problems of Kant's dualism, a revival that produced holistic monism. A peculiarity of Franks' discussion is that at one point he presents Kant in such a way as to exclude him from the monadic individualist position (by means of which he had been contrasted with the post-Kantian monists). Analyzing a review of Kant by H. A. Pistorius in which Pistorius had sought to align Kantianism and Spinozism, Franks writes that Pistorius shows "at most that Spinozism and Kantianism are compatible, since they agree on the negative thesis that empirical things -- including selves -- are not substances …" (96). But if things are not substances in the sense (which of course might be rejected) that they are objects with intrinsic properties, then Franks commits Kant to a view which surely erodes the individualist/holistic division that informs his analysis of the emergence of post-Kantian holism. Kant would not agree with Spinoza that "what we ordinarily call things are modes of a single substance in the transcendental sense: a single infinitely intelligible whole" (92), but this still leaves open the question of the sense in which Kant is intelligible as a monadic individualist. Franks does go on to examine further and clear divisions between Kant and Spinoza which assure us that Kant was no holistic monist (106-108). But given the compatibility that Franks acknowledges, it does seem too much to claim, as he does, that the post-Kantian period of idealism -- German Idealism -- represents a significant departure from Kant (a departure effectively more radical than that between, say, Fichte and Hegel?). And it is therefore little wonder that the post-Kantians did not announce their projects in terms of the revolutionary shift to a monism which would supersede Kant's individualism.

Chapter 4 examines the post-Kantian methods of argument used to establish philosophical points which were not vulnerable to the Agrippan trilemma. Franks argues, somewhat against the current, that it is anachronistic to attribute our contemporary (Strawson-inspired) conception of transcendental argument to the German Idealists. This is indeed a brave claim given the vast range of texts which it aims definitively to judge. Now it is true that the concerns that Strawson and his contemporaries brought to transcendental arguments are those of a different epoch of philosophy, but cannot the form of the argument be translated between the two very differing eras of philosophy? A good case of such a treatment, I would suggest, can be found in Hegel's various critiques of Jacobi. The essence of Hegel's criticism is that Jacobi's efforts to claim that there is a realm of experienced immediacy ("immediate knowing"), which precedes all conceptualization and all language, is doomed to incoherence precisely in that it can only be articulated by means of concepts which Jacobi uses (faith as immediate knowledge: but the very idea of knowledge already assumes a position of conceptuality). It reveals that the conditions of the assertion (conceptuality) undermine the possibility of the denial (of all conceptuality). But is this anachronistic? Franks provides a helpful account of what he understands as "three dimensions of transcendental argumentation" (204) and we can see, in fact, that these apply to the Hegelian example. Under the first dimension, "the character of the conditioned" (204), Franks specifies that "a first-personal possessive always attaches to it, explicitly or implicitly" (205). This is certainly the case for the conditioned in Hegel's critique of Jacobi in that it is the attitude of thought of Jacobi himself with regard to objectivity which is at stake. (We might, in fact, regard Jacobi as the most first-person inclined philosopher of them all.) The second dimension, "the character of the condition" (206), means for the German Idealists arguing "for or from an unconditioned condition" (207). Here admittedly the matter is less straightforward. Deploying Franks' terminology, however, Hegel's argument is a regressive transcendental argument in that it regresses from "grounded to ground" (207) (from knowledge to conceptuality), demonstrating, indeed, that Jacobi's immediate knowing must be compelled, fatally, to recognize its ground. And finally, the "character of the conditional" is that "a conditional expressing the upshot of a transcendental argument makes a claim to necessity" (206), and Hegel's argument against Jacobi demonstrates the philosophical necessity of conceptuality. Now I realize that it is not really fair to propose a counterexample which the space of a review does not allow me to develop adequately. However, I am most interested to know how Franks' account of a non-anachronistic understanding of transcendental argumentation would explain one of Hegel's most famous and philosophically devastating philosophical engagements, one which, it appears, is quite contemporary in its structure.

This is a dispute about a particular issue in Hegel. However, Franks' account of the role of Reinhold (in the same chapter) in the definition of the requirement of philosophical argument post-Kant is extremely valuable, as is the analysis of the reaction of Fichte and Schulze against Reinhold's proposal. Franks brings an analytical acuity which is at all times tempered by a keen historical sensitivity. It is from the analysis of the Schulze-Reinhold debate that Franks provides a superb account of what motivated Fichte to specify his "Grundsatz" in a particular way (232-4): commitment to "an absolutely unconditioned" is a fundamental assumption which comes from the "Derivation and Holistic Monism" which accounts for (228) the unique character of Fichte's analysis of consciousness.

Chapter 5 deals with the legacy of Kant's "facts of reason" in which Kant deduced the laws of morality from practical freedom. As Franks points out, Kant's appeal to "facts of consciousness" was not in fact regarded as "an adequate response to skepticism about morality and freedom" (267). Rather the "reciprocity thesis" (Allison) was especially vulnerable to skepticism regarding the possibility of freedom (266). In the course of his account of how Fichte's distinctive thesis regarding the "epistemic priority" of "the moral law" (301) is a response to the perceived inadequacy of Kant's facts of reason or consciousness, Franks offers an important criticism of a common line of Fichte interpretation. He forcefully demonstrates that Fichte denies "regress to an absolute first principle" (274) on the grounds that the first principle must lie outside the chain of derivation -- must be heterogeneous -- which it would not be were it reached regressively. It could not, in other words, be absolute. By contrast Frederick Neuhouser argues that Fichte begins with a fact of consciousness and then regresses to the conditions that make it possible. Clearly this line of thought seems to crop up in Fichte's texts, particularly when his defence of idealism takes up what looks like an introspective strategy. However, Franks supplies extensive textual support for his claim that Fichte rejects this style of argument. Much of the confusion centres around the complex idea of "intellectual intuition": Kant, as is well known, explicitly rejected the idea of intellectual intuition. But his reasons rested on a "two essences" view (303) in which he denied that a supersensible self can be intuited. However, Fichte redraws the ontology as a "two aspects" account -- empirical and transcendental aspects -- which one can become aware of in oneself as acting. Franks accounts for Fichte's idea of intellectual intuition as follows: the "act of self-positing myself as self-positing plays the role characteristic of an intuition, according to Fichte, because it enables me to have first person cognition, in which I know what I am doing because I am the one doing it" (310). This is an elegantly reached conclusion, in which Franks reveals the specifically philosophical or transcendental perspective required to attain intellectual intuition (thus it is not beyond the realm of discursivity) (312). It might be pointed out that this is not an uncontroversial conclusion. Fichte's account of intellectual intuition -- as interpreted by Dieter Henrich and Frederick Neuhouser -- as a non-representational awareness must pose problems for the relationship Franks finds between positing and articulating. The philosophical issue, in other words, is that of how an intuition comes to be articulated given its non-representational structure.

The book's concluding chapter deals with the question of the competing methods of "construction" and "dialectic" (338). The discussion gives particular attention to Fichte's notion of intellectual intuition and the reason why this would ultimately be his preferred method. In the course of this analysis an issue of enormous historical significance is considered: was Fichte the extravagant subjective idealist the mocking readings of him commonly suggest? With typical hermeneutic thoroughness Franks considers the sources of this particular view. His conclusion demonstrates beyond dispute that Fichte's deduction of the external world is not a creative act but rather that "Fichte can derive determinate features of nature -- such as light and air … -- only as instrumentally necessary for the exercise of human reason" (367). That is not to deny, however, that Fichte was a subjective idealist in any sense. As Franks points out, the subsequent developments of the idealist project by Schelling and Hegel were defensible philosophical responses to Fichte's transcendental legacy, motivated by very specific methodological issues.

Given the massive range of texts that Franks' book considers it must seem unreasonable to ask for more. However, there are a number of claims made about "German Idealism," which although clearly applicable to the period from, say, the immediate reactions to the first Critique up to 1795, are less obviously relevant to Schelling (from the Naturphilosophie onwards) or Hegel. Their works contain a number of significant discussions of the nature of systematicity and why, indeed, that philosophy needs to be systematic. I should like to know how Franks would fit these texts within his account of the development of the concept of systematicity. Nevertheless, All or Nothing ought to be considered the most rigorous analysis of the subjective idealist period (to use Hegel's label) of German Idealism available. I recommend this book not only as a study of that particular period of philosophy but also as an exemplar of how philosophical the history of philosophy can be.