All the Power in the World

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Peter Unger, All the Power in the World, Oxford University Press, 2005, 670pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195155610.

Reviewed by Timothy O'Connor, Indiana University


Peter Unger has been the source of some of the most original, provocative, and engaging philosophical writing of the past several decades. As the title and length of this book suggest, Unger's aim in All the Power in the World is characteristically ambitious. He attempts to show that the supposedly dominant 'Scientiphical Metaphysics' is fundamentally unsatisfactory and offers a comprehensive alternative. The style is conversational and eccentric, with many lengthy asides, remarks (generally disdainful) about the state of academic philosophy, and generous self-quotations from earlier in the same book. These stylistic elements will doubtless annoy some readers, particularly those given to precise formulation of theses and methodical development of arguments. (Though do take a look at p. 409 if you fancy a chuckle at the expense of Ryle.) Still and all (to borrow one of Unger's favorite colloquialisms), it was a deeply engrossing read, at least to this fan of speculative metaphysics. Yet precisely such a metaphysician is left, in the end, with regret for the book that might have been. Despite its great length, many ideas and arguments are underdeveloped. And at some key points, one must decide, on highly ambiguous evidence, just how to interpret what Unger means to be claiming. The weighty tome provides an abundance of material for introducing advanced students to basic metaphysical issues and an array of imaginative options. Its central claims are unlikely to be extensively debated by philosophers, however, as they do not hold up well under careful scrutiny.

The Scientiphical Metaphysic has it that the world is constituted by physical stuff whose distribution at a time is determined by its distribution at earlier times, with the powers of complex physical structures (which include human beings) wholly deriving from the powers of and relations between their parts (6-9). Further, the intrinsic properties of physical entities all fall into the nonoverlapping categories of Spatials, such as shape and size, and Propensities, irreducibly basic dispositions towards this or that manifestation. For Unger's purposes, the importance of this last claim is its implicit denial of Qualities, nondispositional intrinsic features for which Unger points to qualia (intrinsic, simple, and introspectively accessible properties of experience) such as phenomenal blue, for instances. (16)

Setting aside the controversial case of qualia themselves, it is surprising to be told that the denial of qualities in general is a tenet of the dominant metaphysic. At least in analytic metaphysics, the acceptance of qualities and denial of primitive dispositions are quite common, figuring in the neo-Humeanism championed by David Lewis as well as the Armstrong-Tooley brand of causal realism (itself simply a baroque variety of Humeanism).

But never mind Unger's questionable sociology. Unger believes that the denial of qualities is deeply problematic. Here's why: imagine a Newtonian world of small, solid objects (spheres, say) moving in empty space. And now imagine alongside that a negative image of the first world, where the empty space is replaced by a plenum, and the solid spheres are replaced by spherical patches of empty space. If we suppose that particles of the first world and the plenum of the second world have qualities -- worldly analogues of phenomenal blue and other colors -- then there is no problem seeing the difference between the two worlds. (In your mind's eye, let a dull grey stand in for an absence of quality in the two worlds' empty spaces and let your favorite shade of blue completely pervade the solid stuff, whether particle or plenum.) However, if we now delete this coloration of our worlds and positively try to deny the existence of any such qualities, it's no longer clear, Unger contends, that we can grasp any difference at all between the particulate and plenumate worlds. It may just be a difference of words that masks a failure to form a complete and clear conception of either world. (20-24)

Just what we're intended to conclude from this exercise is unclear. Unger says that it shows that a "humanly realistic" philosophy requires the positing of qualities. (I can't help but note here that matters are made all the more confusing by Unger's apparent non-realism about properties [10]. If he really intends to deny any commitment to universals or even tropes, the argument for the necessity of qualities falls on its face. In the end, I found it necessary to bracket Unger's periodic statements in this regard and consider his arguments under the assumption of a trope or immanent universals theory.) "Required" in what sense? Unger nowhere says flat out that a quality-less world is metaphysically impossible. Instead, his statements (see 76 and 87, for example) are always in terms of what we can conceive, and generally what we can clearly and fully conceive. The strongest statement I was able to spot in this connection, when he "suspects" that an ideal cognizer would have the same conceptual difficulty (109), retains the "clear or full" hedge. And when one observes that conceiving physical scenarios is for Unger deeply rooted in visual imagination, the weakness of a mere requirement-for-full-conceivability conclusion becomes clear: one may quite coherently accept the conclusion while denying there are anything like qualities pervading the world. It's just to say that to imaginatively picture the world to oneself one has to supply mental paint, as it were, to mark the appropriate contrasts.

If, instead, Unger really means to be making a case for the metaphysical necessity of qualities, the argument is not at all probative. For one may posit primitive dispositions as the difference makers between the particulate and plenumate worlds: though the worlds resemble one another in an abstract, negative-image sort of way, in the one case it is the smallish particles that interact, driving the world's evolution forward, while in the other, the evolving world state owes to a complex disposition, or perhaps set of dispositions, within the plenum. (One might see difficulties with trying to work this last possibility through, but that is a problem for Unger and his reliance on the ontology of plenums, not his critic.)

Unger considers a problem facing his unusual hypothesis that Qualities and Dispositions (and Spatials) are nonoverlapping sets of properties. At first glance, this looks to imply that qualities have no influence in the world, as all the causal work is done by the dispositions. In Humean fashion -- there is an odd strain of the Humean conceivability-as-disclosing-possibility epistemology running through Unger's case for various elements of his unHumean ontology -- Unger allows that qualities may lack causal influence in some worlds, but he tries to show that they have it in others, of which ours presumably is one. In brief, his suggestion is that we may perfectly well imagine some dispositions that are oriented precisely to the qualities of other objects. We might imagine, for example, a world in which all 'yellow' spheres are disposed to repel with a certain force any other yellow objects that come within a radius of one mile from their center points (90-2).

But Unger's simple suggestion does not suffice to remove the difficulty. Sphere A is disposed to repel yellow objects within a certain distance. Sphere B is yellow and is disposed to be repelled by yellow-repellers. But imagine that the yellowness of B were to be annihilated, all else remaining the same. Since, by hypothesis, it remains disposed to be so repelled, this appears to show that its yellowness is doing no work in the original case. Unger could say that being disposed to attraction by yellow attractors necessitates being yellow, and vice versa. But once such a line is taken, it's hard to see why we shouldn't both generalize this suggestion to all qualities and then bring dispositions and qualities together by positing that qualities are themselves inherently dispositional. Unger's case against such a natural (and common) move just comes down to a Humean thought experiment: for any scenario where a quality and an active disposition towards some effect co-vary, we can imagine another where they come apart. (Blue particles may be disposed in one eon to attracting red particles, while disposed to attracting green particles in another (105).) But where is the governing principle behind this semi-Humean fantasizing, on which certain receptive dispositions are imagined to be necessarily linked with qualities (thereby securing the causal influence of qualities), while all is contingency on the active side of the transaction? Furthermore, isn't this just creating a make-work program that cannot possibly have a connection to our empirical theories? (If we must accept the bifurcation, it will be Unger's dispositions, not the qualities, that are candidates for identification with primitive scientific properties such as negative charge.)

There are other problems with Unger's treatment of dispositions, the chief of which is that he posits a most unlovely assortment of them. We have propensities to monotony, to change, to annihilation -- but all instanced here and there purely contingently, so that it is entirely possible for objects to pop in or out of existence without any causal precondition whatsoever, even in a world that is otherwise full of dispositional interactions! And while there may be no actual yellow attractors or annihilators, since they are possible, every actual yellow thing must have the disposition to be attracted or annihilated by such non-actual entities. (And what holds for one conceivability-driven instance holds for every other, with the result that there is an infinite variety of primitive dispositions had by the homeliest of objects.) And worst of all to my mind -- because running afoul of widely shared intuitions about the very nature of causation -- are the haecceitistic dispositions some objects have to interact not with objects of some or other general type of object, but with an individual object, A (even where A is a composite object that over time undergoes a total change of parts!) And, as we'll see shortly, haecceitistic dispositions are no inessential feature of Unger's thought; they are absolutely central to his development and defense of a strong form of mind-body dualism.

Dispositions pose difficulties for anyone's views. There has been a revived interest in views that treat dispositionality as ontologically fundamental, with excellent recent treatments in monographs by Stephen Mumford, George Molnar, and John Heil. Unger barely takes note of this work, telling us that he elected not to engage with it since it would be more useful to the reader to see an uncluttered presentation of a distinctive view (107-8).  It is fair enough to not want an original view to be buried under a mass of scholarly digressions and footnotes. But Unger would have done well, it seems to me, to have also entertained the humbler thought that the best development of one's own view comes through careful engagement with others.

Finally, there is Unger's defense of mind-body dualism, which is the centerpiece of the entire work (Ch.6-7). It does not rest, as you might expect, on reflections on the phenomenal or intentional character of conscious experience. Instead, for Unger, materialism comes to grief when we reflect on certain variations on the Problem of the Many.  The composite structures that we observe in ordinary experience do not admit sharp boundaries. For any given electron hovering 'on the surface' of a desk, say, it seems an arbitrary matter whether we suppose it to be part of 'the' desk or not. And suppose one's mind reels at the thought of 'fuzzy objects.' We may find it natural to conclude, as Unger does, that, strictly speaking, there are a great many perfectly precise desk-sized objects where we originally took there to be one, although they overlap almost entirely. But now consider that the Problem of the Many is no less applicable to a given living human body, or human brain, or some favored part thereof. Here, if we are materialists, the problem is not so easily resolvable, since we know introspectively that our bodies or brains 'promote' but one experiencer and, even more plainly to Unger's mind, one chooser -- one being with a power to choose fully and freely from among available alternatives. Since there is no nonarbitrary physical candidate to be the experiencer-cum-chooser that I am, I must be a nonphysical being that merely acts on and through these many overlapping bodies.

This is but a quick outline of the argument for dualism that Unger presents. How does Unger respond to a similar problem facing his own dualist view? Observe that where you see a single living human body, whose exact boundaries are perhaps problematic, Unger sees a vast number of largely overlapping bodies with perfectly sharp boundaries. In addition, however, there is a nonphysical soul who is the person, a soul that is thought to emerge from and be sustained by the particles of … well, which particles, of which body, exactly? Presumably, each of the many body-shaped composites (or more directly relevant, brain-shaped composites) is causally sufficient for causing the emergence of a soul. So why aren't there ever so many souls here (and thus "too many choosers")? Unger's answer is to suppose that each of the many particles work together toward a "singular resolution as to what conscious experiencer they promote" (425). That is to say, the particles all work together (when organized in the right way) towards the generation of a single nonphysical mind. There is massive redundancy (delete a small number of particles and the cooperative causing and sustaining relation remains unchanged) rather than parallel and independent activities of different complexes.

Now consider a parallel position that might be taken by a position standing midway between materialism and mind-body dualism, what Unger dubs a "nonentity emergentist" view of conscious mental events. On this view, under the right circumstances, particular conscious experiences and a capacity to choose, wholly distinct from any complex physical event, emerge and are sustained. There is a dualism of events, but not of fundamental substance.[1] In response to the question why we do not have many indistinguishable conscious experiences separately promoted by overlapping physical complexes that are each sufficient to generate such states, one can follow Unger in saying that there is massive redundancy at the level of individual particles in working towards a singular resolution. So far, so good. But Unger will say that only his view gives you a single experiencer that is the subject of the single experience promoted. On nonentity emergentism, the candidates for subject of the experience are physical complexes, and there are too many of them, equally qualified for the role. So on this alternative, we get many experiencers sharing the same experience (a view of doubtful coherence), and many choosers sharing the same choosing (about whose incoherence there can be no doubt). Here, I believe, the nonentity emergentist should take a 'fuzzy composition' approach to thinkers, on which a particle's helping to constitute a complex object admits of degrees.[2]

Unger will doubtless say this is too outlandish a view to be taken seriously. But, as always in metaphysics, we need to fully vet the alternative being urged upon us. There are well-known challenges to the plausibility of substance dualism that I will not consider here. (I will, however, invite the reader to inspect Unger's less-than-compelling response to one of them on 451-52.) I will simply note one that is not much discussed, though it deserves to be.[3] The particles constituting a human brain that, on Unger's view, generate and sustain a soul are, it now appears, a changing collection. Yet, throughout this continual change, he supposes (following commonsense) that there is a single experiencing and choosing soul that is both affected by and affects the activity of the sustaining particles. But how can this be? If Unger is right, a particle that once helped to sustain Caesar's soul might now be sustaining yours. Indeed, it has the potential to sustain any actual or possible soul. What determines which soul a particle helps to sustain at any moment? When we note that all the particles in your brain are on the same footing here (there is no 'pilot' particle that is uniquely oriented to your soul and from which the others can take their cue), the perplexity becomes acute. I'm unclear as to how Unger is thinking about this question when it comes to the initial generation of a soul. (Why did all those particles present at the groundbreaking event generate you as opposed to some other soul?) But even setting that aside, we may wonder about eddie the electron, once disposed to join with other particles in promoting the soul which was Caesar and now so disposed with respect to you. Unger speculates that eddie, by coming to be in the neighborhood of an organized collection of you-promoting particles, acquires that same disposition, just as he lost the disposition to promote Caesar once he ceased to be part of his brain (457-58). I leave it to the reader to decide how such a response affects the comparative plausibility of Unger's view and the alternative noted in the previous paragraph.

There are too many bold speculative ideas in Unger's book to discuss them all. He suggests that the souls of every sentient being might be generic, with differences of realized capacities to be accounted for by differences in sustaining and receiving bodies (when it comes to you and your dog, "you've got a grand piano, so to say; she's got a darned kazoo" 455); that souls might have a natural but bleak immortality, because apart from the unlikely prospect of reincarnation, we'll have no experiences ("Though we may well all become disembodied, that will all be to no avail" 510); and that physical particles and souls, while utterly disparate, "may have all originated from some single richly Propensitied individual" (598). One might naturally expect on this last hypothesis a careful consideration of at least some of the strands of the project of philosophical theology. But here Unger's speculative boldness unexpectedly and disappointingly retreats. All we get is an indignant rant (501-8) reciting a catalogue of horrors down through the ages. ("How horrible is that, I ask you, all you who dare to uphold, quite as heartlessly propounded as it's brainlessly affirmed, any claim that's even the least bit like the utterly incredible BENEVOLENT ALMIGHTY CREATOR?" 507).

But we shouldn't end at a point where Unger's high degree of freedom from intellectual fashion fails him. All the Power in the World brims with imaginative and engaging ideas on matters of basic metaphysics. If it fails to work out those ideas into an overall system worthy of sustained reflection and engagement, many of its elements are apt to be picked up, retooled, and appropriated in service of other philosophical visions. For this reason alone, it is worth the careful attention of all with a taste for grand metaphysics.


[1] See Timothy O'Connor and Jonathan Jacobs, "Emergent Individuals," Philosophical Quarterly, 53 (2003), 540-555.

[2]  See the seminal work by Peter van Inwagen, Material Beings (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990). It is very odd and unfortunate that Unger makes no mention of this important work that has done so much to shape contemporary discussion of problems associated with material composition.

[3] This objection is powerfully developed in part III of Hong Yu Wong's "Cartesian Psychophysics," in Peter van Inwagen and Dean Zimmerman, eds., Persons: Human and Divine (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).