An Image of the Soul in Speech: Plato and the Problem of Socrates

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David N. McNeill, An Image of the Soul in Speech: Plato and the Problem of Socrates, Penn State Press, 2010, 345pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271035857.

Reviewed by George Rudebusch, Northern Arizona University



In this work, McNeill pursues two of Nietzsche’s psychological questions about Socrates:

1. “Is Socratic dialectic an expression of a thwarted desire for political mastery?” (5)

2. Is the life of Socratic examination humanly sustainable?

After an introduction framing the issues, the next five chapters of the book interpret passages from individual dialogues: three chapters on Republic 1 and one each on the Gorgias and Protagoras. The last four chapters interpret Plato’s views on eros, madness, poetry, psychology, and ontology.

Some, perhaps most, of the arguments in Plato are open to obvious objections. Readers who take the objections to be successful have two interpretive options. One is to suppose Plato could not reason well. The second option is to suppose that his character Socrates did not intend such bad arguments seriously.

McNeill falls into the latter group. His Socrates knowingly draws fallacious conclusions, but does not seriously intend to argue for those conclusions. McNeill believes he is able to discern, from his scrutiny of the ways the arguments go wrong, unstated conclusions that Socrates wants us to accept, instead of the explicit conclusions in the text.

One result of the book is that there is a non-intellectualist Socratic moral psychology throughout “Socrates’ philosophic practice” (2). This result is of course contrary to Socrates’ explicit conclusions in the dialogues. To be sure, in some passages, such as Republic IV, Socrates explicitly argues against intellectualism: dikaiosunē (righteousness or justice) is a harmony of the rational, spirited, and appetitive parts of the soul, where each of the three parts “does its own work in ruling and being ruled” (443b1-2). But in Republic I, for example, Socrates explicitly argues for intellectualism: the general human excellence of dikaiosunē is wisdom (sophia, 350d4-5). McNeill’s method enables him to deny that explicit conclusions in the text — at least, those that McNeill deems objectionable — provide evidence even for the views of the proponent of the argument, Socrates, much less for the author Plato.

McNeill’s method throughout the book is to raise an objection to an argument, and then take the objection to point to an unstated conclusion that Socrates intends to demonstrate, rather than the explicitly elicited conclusion. Here are a few examples.

1. In book 1 of the Republic Socrates elicits from Polemarchus the explicit conclusion that “the art of justice is as much an art of stealing as it is an art of guarding against theft” (69). By looking at the argument McNeill proposes to show that “the individual claims that Socrates and ”SpellE">Polemarchus agree upon are highly questionable, and even under the most charitable of interpretations the inferences are invalid" (69). McNeill then proposes an unstated conclusion, that Socrates “is trying to demonstrate … the problem of the relation between dispositions to act and the ends of actions” (71).

2. “It has been common for readers of Plato from Nietzsche onward to consider [Socrates’ explicit statement at ”">Republic 604d1-2 that a ’man’s deliberation must direct him toward the end of “correcting and restoring what has fallen and is ill”‘] … an aspect of Socrates’ self-representation in the Republic. However, [McNeill has] every reason to question this assumption … as representing Socrates’ views" (231).

3. According to McNeill, the argument at Republic 374e-376c, that dogs have something in common with philosophers, “is clearly a joke … [that] should motivate us to … question the various moves and identifications Socrates has made” in the entire discussion of the guardians (256).

4. Bernard Williams has criticized Plato’s Republic for its moral psychology of a detached, intellectual moral self. While McNeill agrees that “”SpellE">Williams’s critique of the overly abstract picture of moral agency … is very much on target," McNeill “will suggest that it is part of Plato’s intention that we confront these paradoxes” (281-2). The objection “points out the very problems … that [McNeill believes] Plato intends us to see” (289).

I myself sometimes argue for unstated conclusions in Plato’s texts, and that ought to motivate me to stand shoulder to shoulder with McNeill. Yet there seem to me a number of defects in his method.

Consider McNeill’s interpretation of Republic 9 as an illustration. In that passage Socrates elicits from Glaucon the explicit conclusion that people in whom the rational part of the soul rules have the “most pleasant life” (583a2-3). Considering Socrates’ argument for the explicit conclusion, McNeill objects to the argument’s move from subjective experiences to objective conclusions about good living. McNeill then judges that “these very problems point to” Socrates’ intended, albeit unstated, conclusion, namely, that “the way in which the attempt to self-consciously justify a certain way of life to others can alter the experience of that very way of life” (42). Here there are a number of problems.

1. Hit or miss application. Republic 9 contains three arguments for the conclusion that rationally ruled souls have the most pleasant life (571a-580d, 580d-583b, and 583b-588b). McNeill tries to show only that the second argument is invalid. Without showing that the other two arguments are also invalid, there can be no confidence in his conclusion. This seeming defect is not limited to the trio of arguments in Republic 9. There are many complementary arguments for similar conclusions throughout Plato’s writings. In general, it seems to me that McNeill would need to show the invalidity of all arguments for similar conclusions. But he does not do so.

2. Negligence. McNeill raises an intelligent objection about Socrates’ move from subjective considerations to objective conclusions. But McNeill ignores the possibility that there are replies to his objection. One way to try to anticipate replies is to study published objections and replies. For instance, both Julia Annas (An Introduction to Plato’s Republic [Oxford: Clarendon: 1981] 307-310) and C. D. C. Reeve (Philosopher-Kings [Princeton: Princeton U. P., 1988] 145-6) have raised objections that are similar to McNeill’s objection — and both have given intelligent replies to the objection. That McNeill fails to anticipate and indeed ignores published replies to objections he raises seems negligent to me.

3. Over-confidence. While Reeve confidently judges that the subjectivity objection fails, Annas more modestly judges that the argument is “more defensible than is commonly allowed” (ibid. 307). It is possible that Reeve and Annas are wrong in their defenses of the argument. But McNeill’s method requires not merely that the argument’s defenders be wrong, but that they are so obviously wrong that Plato’s readers will get the joke, as it were, in any effort to try to defend such a silly argument. It seems to me that such a requirement reveals that McNeill is over-confident about his ability to show Glaucon’s foolishness in assenting to Socrates’ conclusion.

4. Lack of charity. It is a feature of McNeill’s method that it must judge Socrates’ interlocutors as foolish, since they lack the discernment of the others in Socrates’ audience or Plato’s readership, others who are able readily to see that Socrates is not seriously arguing for his explicit conclusion. Indeed McNeill goes farther in putting a negative construction upon Glaucon, whom he diagnoses as a narcissist (296-7) and “sadistic” (291). It seems to me that, other things being equal, we should prefer an interpretation according to which the conversations in the dialogues are reflections of the highest possible philosophical intelligence on the part of the characters, and that, other things being equal, we should rule out first those interpretations according to which the conversations need to be explained as the product of psychological disorders.

5. Eisegesis. Like McNeill, Annas finds fault with Socrates’ argument. But she finds fault on the basis of a different objection than McNeill. The objection Annas raises stems from “a tension in Plato’s notion of the philosopher” (ibid. 310) — a tension between, on the one hand, an academic lover of learning and on the other a ruler of experience and practical wisdom. Notice that it is a feature of McNeill’s method that it would have Annas propose, on the basis of her objection, not only that Socrates did not seriously intend to draw his explicit conclusion, but also that Annas’s objection points to Socrates’ truly intended, albeit unstated, conclusion, namely, that there is a tension between an academic and a practical life. Indeed, for every objection we raise to the argument, McNeill’s method will ascribe a distinct implicit conclusion to the text. The defect of the method is that it ascribes an intended implicit conclusion to the text on the basis of whatever objection occurs to whatever reader, coming to the text with background assumptions different from the author’s. Thus McNeill’s method seems to be unrestrained eisegesis rather than proper interpretation. Those who use McNeill’s method “make Plato responsible for their own thoughts and fancies, never dreamed of by the writer” (to paraphrase Philip Schaff on “allegorical and typological” interpreters of the Bible, Through Bible Lands [New York: American Tract Society, 1878] 53).

6. Self-refuting. According to McNeill’s method, an invalid argument in the text, as shown by an objection, justifies us in interpreting Socrates as not seriously arguing for his explicit conclusion. This method seems to be self-refuting in two ways. If invalidity rules out the explicit conclusion as the correct interpretation of the text, then invalidity is a much stronger argument to rule out unstated conclusions — and McNeill does not provide valid arguments to establish what he takes to be Socrates’ unstated conclusions. So the method, if it does establish McNeill’s reading of the text, also seems to rule out McNeill’s reading of the text. In addition, since McNeill does not give valid arguments for McNeill’s explicit conclusions (they are, e.g., “gestures,” 42, or “suggestions,” 71), McNeill’s method would have us deny that McNeill seriously intends his explicit conclusions.

These seeming defects keep me from accepting the book’s method and conclusions.