An Interpretation of Nietzsche's On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life

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Anthony K. Jensen, An Interpretation of Nietzsche's On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life, Routledge, 2016, 189pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138816466.

Reviewed by Mark Alfano, Delft University of Technology


Anthony K. Jensen has successfully undertaken an essential project for the fields of Nietzsche studies and philosophy of history. In his interpretation of Nietzsche's second "Untimely Meditation," On the Uses and Disadvantages for Life[1] (henceforth HL), he demonstrates an attention to detail and meticulousness sometimes bordering on obsessiveness. This textual work is based on Jensen's comprehensive familiarity with the philosophical, philological, and historiographic culture in which Nietzsche was trained and to which he was in part responding. Unlike many Anglophone philosophers interested in Nietzsche, Jensen is fully at home with German language and idiom. He combines this linguistic facility with philological expertise and encyclopedic archival research to bring sober clarity to a field often plagued by flights of interpretive speculation. Jensen is knowledgeable of not only the Anglophone but also the Germanophone secondary literatures, and he uses this expertise like a wide-angle lens to give his readers a synoptic perspective on the last thirteen decades of reactions to and interpretations of HL. I hasten to add, though, that his monograph is not simply a summary of the production, content, and reception of one of Nietzsche's early works; it is also a judicious philosophical evaluation of Nietzsche's views and arguments. It may not be the last word on HL, but the prospect of adding anything new and valuable is now daunting.

Jensen's book is organized into six chapters. In this review, I will describe some of its especially interesting claims, arguments, and revelations, then offer a few words of friendly criticism.

"Text and Context" documents Nietzsche's intellectual biography and the world of contemporaneous German historiography. It also describes the production and publication process of HL, for which 'tortured' is an understatement. This chapter offers two surprising take-aways. First, neither the first nor the second edition of HL adequately represents Nietzsche's intentions, and even the best Anglophone translations suffer further problems. Jensen argues that the most adequate English translation of the title is the clunky 'On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life', giving the lie to etymological- and rhyme-based translations that employ 'Uses and Abuses' or 'Advantages and Disadvantages' (11-13). However, it seems that little weight should be put on the title because Nietzsche himself wished to change it, perhaps to 'We Historians: On the Historical Sickness of the Modern Soul' (11). This jibes with Nietzsche's own evaluation of HL in Ecce Homo, where he claims that the essence of the work is a critique of the historical sickness.[2] More substantively, the text was composed in three main chunks. Sections 1-9 were written first, then were sandwiched between the Foreward and a dashed-off version of section 10 that was not even Nietzsche's own final text. Jensen reproduces facsimiles of some of this text, which Nietzsche sent to the publisher, as well as examples of significant changes he made to the proofs (27-9). These seem to have been ignored, making the version of HL we have a kind of penultimate draft.

Second, the memorable historical-unhistorical-Überhistorical and monumental-antiquarian-critical triads were almost afterthoughts in the composition of HL. Initially, Nietzsche had nothing to say about the third term in either triad (14). This doesn't mean that the triads somehow falsify Nietzsche's thought, but it does place a burden of proof on any interpreter who wishes to make too much hay of the Überhistorical or the critical modes -- neither of which reappears explicitly in Nietzsche's later writings.

"Historicity" explains Nietzsche's novel insight that humans' senses of their own pasts (and with these, the power sometimes to forget their pasts) cause existential crises that come in three varieties: moral, psychological, and epistemological (46). This chapter also provides an interpretation of the first of HL's well-known but over-interpreted triads: historical-unhistorical-Überhistorical. Jensen points out that it is an entirely original Nietzschean insight that both remembering and forgetting are motivated and affective mental acts, not pristine impressions and erasures. We make and remember commitments using language; these ossified commitments then exert normative force on us (46). We latch onto past events and cannot move on until they are explained (47). We remember our own past achievements and iniquities, which leads us to distinctively human moral reactions like pride, shame, guilt, regret, and dissimulation. Beyond these moral consequences of human memory, there are psychological and epistemological problems. Human animals, unlike most or all others, are capable of getting so hung up on the past that they cannot move forward effectively into the future. In addition, human memory serves as both a power and an injunction to classify new experiences as another X or another Y. But, following Heraclitus, Nietzsche holds that no two Xs or Ys are identical, so our classifications are always at best misleading.

The second half of chapter 2 concerns the nature of forgetting as an active power of the mind, as well as the ratio between remembering and forgetting, which Jensen uses to distinguish among the triad historical-unhistorical-Überhistorical. A historical attitude typically leads one to remember too much and forget too little, leading to a kind of cognitive constipation. An unhistorical attitude may lead one to go too far in deleting unpleasant or disgusting aspects of one's individual or collective past. An Überhistorical attitude, if there were such a thing, might involve a certain kind of balance. However, as Jensen shows in this and the previous chapter, Nietzsche's conception of the Überhistorical is at best vague and more than likely contradictory. Perhaps the most attractive conception to be extracted from this mélange is an attitude that views past exemplars as not merely objects of emulation but as ideal competitors: ones who can be admired even while one tries to surpass them (59).

"Typical Historians" shows how Nietzsche's epistemology shifted from his hopelessly confused and unfinished draft, On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense, to the sophisticated constructivism on display in HL. The central aim of this chapter is to explain the distinctions among monumental, antiquarian, and critical histories. Monumental history is useful insofar as it inspires great actions by those who engage with it. This places monumental history at odds with the mundane but undeniable requirement that history be at least an approximation of the truth (70). To translate the worry into contemporary terms (a kind of editorializing that Jensen scrupulously avoids but I cannot resist), those inspired by the mantra "Make America Great Again" tend to have little patience for the niceties of truth, context, and nuance. Such a "delusional hope in the recurrence of better times" (72) is often accompanied by a disposition to accept any bold action as another X (where X is construed as admirable) and a paradoxical tendency to constrain one's ambitions to what one (erroneously) thinks was accomplished by past exemplars.

Jensen correctly points out that, for all its faults, monumental history does not receive Nietzsche's categorical rejection; instead, and as his title suggests, he thinks that each of the three forms of history has its uses and disadvantages (74). Antiquarian history, for example, forges and reinvigorates bonds between neighbors and generations, but it always threatens to descend into all-consuming nostalgia, with no sense of taste and contempt applied to the past. Likewise, critical history serves a "brush-clearing" function (76), but if it runs amok it engenders a "stultifying" disequilibrium (77). Thus, none of the three elements of the triad emerges triumphant. Instead, each is to be assessed ambivalently in terms of its uses and disadvantages for life.

"Scientific Historiography" takes up the questions of the extent to which -- in reality and according to Nietzsche -- history is capable of descriptive accuracy, explanatory power, and objectivity. These questions are addressed from epistemological and cultural points of view. The chapter focuses primarily on the question of objectivity. Before getting to this topic, Jensen argues that Nietzsche holds that historians cannot represent the past as it really was for two reasons. First, historians actively construct their accounts rather than passively receiving them. Second, historians inevitably engage in categorization that -- as per the Heraclitean point mentioned above -- obscures the particularities of what really happened. Also before turning to objectivity, Jensen shows that the highly-demanding conceptions of nomological explanation available in Nietzsche's time do not fit historiography -- and that Nietzsche understood this.

The two conceptions of objectivity on offer in Nietzsche's time were the Schopenhauerian "value-free" and the Rankean "value-neutral" approaches. On the former, it was possible, in special circumstances, to evacuate oneself of all will, desire, valuation, and so on, allowing a purely cognitive vision of the world. On the latter, conative factors are inextricable but permissible when they accord with common values. Jensen persuasively argues that Nietzsche rejects both of these conceptions of objectivity in favor of his own perspectivism, grounded in a kind of epistemic justice. Those familiar with Nietzsche may be surprised to see him celebrating justice, which he typically ignores or denigrates. It will come as no surprise, then, that this is a highly idiosyncratic notion of justice, which privileges the agent of justice rather than its patient or victim. For Nietzsche, objectivity as justice is delivered by a historian with the "quality of character that would enable him to stand above that which he judges. Those qualities include courage, honesty, resolution, and self-control" (111). A just historian knows what is suitably inspiring, what is worthy of preservation, and what must be excised. These constitute his objectivity, which seems to fit best within a Nietzschean virtue epistemology. Whether there are any grounds for such an epistemology beyond Nietzsche's own self-aggrandizement is an open question.

"Teleology" turns to the question of whether historians can and should attempt to ferret out the meaning of historical events and trends in terms of progress towards a rational goal, a la Hegel (among others).[3] Nietzsche's answer is a resounding No. Instead of searching for final causes, he says, historians should engage in and encourage a kind of agonistic competition with great exemplars from the past. For Nietzsche, history is a "selective construction out of only that which in the past was 'justly' judged worthy to serve as an . . . [other] which, by its opposition, can sharpen and strengthen the qualities in the reader that best serve life" (145). According to Jensen, this is Nietzsche's affirmative conception of history in HL, which he proposes as an alternative to the entire triad monumental-antiquarian-critical. It might seem at first blush like a reiteration of the monumental stance: selectively constructing a hit parade of great exemplars from the past. However, this positive conception of history lacks the drawbacks that Nietzsche identifies for monumental history: "greatness is bestowed by the valuative activities of the just judge and it is our present-day duty to surpass the former types in their measure of greatness. Affirmative history is about neither recognition nor emulation, but both legislation and competition" (146). In this way, affirmative history serves life better than monumental history, which tends to erect idols that shout, "Here and no further!"

Finally, in "After History," Jensen covers the immediate critical reception of HL, traces the similarities and differences between the epistemologies of HL and On the Genealogy of Morals[4], and summarizes the influence of HL on later philosophers, historians, and -- for want of a better word -- "intellectuals" (e.g., Francis Fukuyama and Isaiah Berlin). Given the strikingly bizarre production and publication process of HL mentioned above, along with Nietzsche's own documented dissatisfaction with the published version of it, one might expect that Jensen would conclude by urging not the end of history but the end of History for Life. He convincingly argues to the contrary in chapter 6. There are several reasons for continued philosophical study of HL, but the main one is HL's clear pre-figuring of Nietzsche's perspectivism, which is crucially a perspectivism not of perceptual but of affective and evaluative points of view.

I could easily envision a fascinating seminar that focused on HL and the Genealogy, using Jensen's interpretation of the former and various papers on the latter as guides. (There is as yet no book-length treatment of the Genealogy to match Jensen's interpretation of HL.) The only problem with such a seminar is the outrageous cost of the book: $145.00. Let us hope that it goes to paperback.

[1] Nietzsche, Friedrich. Untimely Meditations, Cambridge University Press, 1874/1997. Translation by R. J. Hollingdale. Edited by Daniel Breazeale.

[2] Nietzsche, Friedrich. The Anti-Christ, Ecce Homo, Twilight of the Idols. Cambridge University Press, 1908/2005. Translation by Judith Norman. Edited by Aaron Ridley and Judith Norman.

[3] Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich. Introduction to the Philosophy of History, Hackett, 1837/1988. Translation by Leo Rauch.

[4] Nietzsche, Friedrich. On the Genealogy of Morals. Cambridge University Press, 1887/2006. Translation by Carol Diethe. Edited by Keith Ansell-Pearson.