An Introduction to Africana Philosophy

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Lewis R. Gordon, An Introduction to Africana Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 275pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521675468.

Reviewed by Jacoby Adeshei Carter, CUNY: John Jay College


An Introduction to Africana Philosophy begins, as any text with that or any similar title should, with a discussion of the difficulties of firmly fixing an accurate conception of Africana philosophy. It is Gordon's aim to introduce Africana philosophy as a modern philosophy, where the modern period is inaugurated by the discovery of the "new world" and the institution of the Atlantic Slave Trade and continues on to the present. Gordon presents the reader with a veritable Who's Who of intellectuals who have made some contribution to Africana philosophy from antiquity to the present day. The result is a comprehensive, yet nuanced, account of how and by whom central themes in Africana philosophy have originated and been developed over time throughout the diaspora. For the most part, Gordon's book gives a comprehensive account of the wide ranging field of Africana philosophy while also providing a close look at its instantiations in particular thinkers and select geographic regions. Gordon makes an effort to pay attention to the emergence and development of central themes in various parts of the diaspora though, on the whole, the book is heavily weighted in favor of discussions of African American and Afro-Caribbean philosophy over African philosophy.

While Gordon means to treat Africana philosophy as a modern philosophy beginning roughly around the sixteenth-century, there is a noticeable absence of discussion of principle figures in this philosophical school for much of the sixteenth- and seventeenth-centuries -- a period of time during which much that could be thought of as falling under the rubric of Africana philosophy was taking place primarily in African Muslim populations -- though he does treat many of the philosophical themes of this period as they were later taken up in the eighteenth- and nineteenth-centuries. In the second chapter, Gordon's task is to reveal the philosophical problems that first characterized this area of philosophy and to see to what extent concern with those issues continues to shape discourse in the field. As Gordon is keenly aware, Africana philosophy is often a mixed bag, in that important contributions are commonly made by thinkers who are not usually regarded as philosophers. He uncovers several themes principal among which are attention to issues of philosophical anthropology, concern for the meaning of civilization, attention to notions of freedom and liberty, the importance of questions of identity in relation to history and culture, and the importance of second order reflection on thought itself.

In the third chapter, Gordon narrows his focus a bit to African-American philosophy and considers contributions from three central figures: Anna Julia Cooper, W.E.B. DuBois and Frantz Fanon. Gordon points out that Cooper's analysis of the worth of persons offers a critique of American society for its failure to comprehend the correct conception of worth, and the attendant failure of misallocating social resources, and thereby stifling social progress. Her view of the value of human persons offers us insights into three of the crucial philosophical issues identified earlier; namely, concerns about philosophical anthropology, the meaning of civilization, and notions of freedom and liberation. DuBois, like Fanon, is one of those figures in Africana philosophy with far reaching influence. Gordon focuses on DuBois's notion of double consciousness, a concept which touches on nearly every theme in Africana philosophy that originates in the eighteenth- and nineteenth-centuries, while emphasizing questions of philosophical anthropology and humanity in relation to history, culture and civilization. One might wonder why Fanon is included in a chapter that discusses African-American philosophy (especially when there is another chapter dedicated to Afro-Caribbean philosophy). Gordon does so because he views Fanon as one of a few Africana thinkers whose influence is so far reaching that they cannot easily be compartmentalized into specific subsets of the field and, what is more, to attempt to do so is to form a myopic view of Africana philosophy. Gordon identifies three key features of Fanon's thought that have made lasting contributions to nearly all of the thematics and problems of Africana philosophy, namely: the notion of sociogenesis, the concept of epistemological colonization, and an approach to psychoanalysis through the concept of failure.

Gordon is concerned in the fourth chapter with exploring the various trajectories that Africana philosophy has followed in the United States and Great Britain. He identifies seven philosophical schools through which, in his view, people have taken up themes and problems which characterize Africana philosophy: pragmatism, feminism, afrocentrism and afrocentricity, analytical philosophy, continental philosophy, Marxism, existentialism and phenomenology. Gordon's criticism of African-American and prophetic pragmatism and black feminism and womanist thought is that both traditions are primarily critical of the past and present and do not produce new ideas out of which to shape a better future. Unfortunately, Gordon gets pragmatism wrong here. Thanks to the work of philosophers such as Leonard Harris, pragmatists have been forced to consider that pragmatism is not uniquely American and is not the first philosophical movement in the United States. Gordon goes on to criticize the failure of pragmatism to acknowledge the other philosophical influences on the formulation and approach to problems particularly when those formulations and approaches are not obviously pragmatist. He primarily has Cornell West in mind here, and the criticism may be correct if applied in that limited way, but as a criticism of all of African American pragmatism, or of pragmatism in general, it is quite unfair. Pragmatists, in fact, are quite willing to acknowledge similarities to and influences from various parts of the continental tradition, without thinking that their work is reducible to those traditions.

From here Gordon moves on to a consideration of African-American philosophy. The application of analytical philosophy to issues affecting black people constitutes African-American analytical philosophy on his view. Gordon's classification of some contemporary philosophers into the various camps that he identifies under the rubric of African-American analytical philosophy is at times misleading. African-American analytical philosophy, on Gordon's view, falls victim to a criticism advanced by both DuBois and Fanon; namely, an inability to take a critical view of its own methodological presuppositions. As a result, one finds that a Eurocentric meta-narrative is often imposed on one's understanding of black problems. It is interesting that Gordon notes that the same objection could be made in response to African-American and Afro-British European continental philosophy. However, black existentialism and phenomenology, according to Gordon, have the decided advantage over the philosophical schools mentioned of not being bound by disciplinary or methodological commitments. Borrowing from Fanon, he notes that the realm of human experience is incomplete in the sense that reality ultimately transcends any interpretive model or methodology one constructs to understand it. In regard to black existentialism and phenomenology, Gordon contends that the objection is unsuccessful because those who do work in this area engage the European tradition without centering it. In so doing, black existentialism and phenomenology treat neither the problems nor the methodologies of European philosophers as indispensable aspects of the discipline of philosophy. Why Gordon does not make the same observation with regard to African-American analytical philosophy is never explained. Presumably, the idea is that as practitioners of a subspecies of analytical philosophy, African-American analytical philosophy is, if nothing else, committed to the method of analysis characteristic of the field. It is unfortunate that in his criticism of black and prophetic pragmatism Gordon overlooks the fact that pragmatism also manages not to be dogmatically committed to any particular problems or methodology. It is undeniable that pragmatists -- and I venture to add African-American analytical philosophers -- have their preferred instrumentalities which they employ to solve the problems that concern them. But such an observation is equally true of even the most staunch non-disciplinarian. Gordon's unfairness to these traditions is, I think, the result of both a lack of thorough familiarity with the traditions, and his preference for existentialism and phenomenology.

The sixth chapter focuses on Afro-Caribbean philosophy. Gordon describes the history of Afro-Caribbean philosophy as a series of attempts at "appearance" to emphasize his understanding of this iteration of Africana philosophy as primarily concerned with the themes of philosophical anthropology, second-order reflections on method, personal identity and post-colonialism. The first attempt at appearance in the Afro-Caribbean world came by way of the Haitian revolution. From the Haitian Revolution on, subsequent efforts at appearance were epitomized in the work of specific individuals the first of which was Marcus Garvey, followed by Aime Cesaire. These efforts at appearance culminated eventually in the work of Frantz Fanon who has had a lasting influence on all subsequent developments in Afro-Caribbean philosophy from then to the present.

Gordon devotes the last chapter of the text to a discussion of African philosophy. His examination ranges from the ontology of persons in the philosophy of the Akan peoples of West Africa to contemporary philosophical problematics concerning political and social life. Gordon's treatment of African philosophy reveals a great deal about his conception of Africana philosophy. Over the course of the book, Gordon relies on a racial conception of Africana philosophy to the exclusion of a geographical understanding of the field. The philosophical work of persons on the African continent that does not deal with any of the themes that he identifies as central to Africana philosophy is either mentioned only in passing or left altogether untreated in his text. It may well be that such tragic choices cannot be avoided. In the end, however, this does not show that Gordon has arbitrarily or maliciously chosen one conception of Africana philosophy over another. In fact, Gordon has done a masterful job of showing how it is that one can take a unified, though not monolithic, view of this diverse field of study.

Gordon has managed to provide a detailed and insightful introduction to Africana philosophy useful to students coming to the field for the first time and to those who already have some familiarity with it. His book points readers to historically important people, to developments in Africana philosophy, and to contemporary scholars in the field and their reconsiderations of its themes and problems. For those interested in using the text in their classes, it will likely need to be supplemented with other course material as it is at times rather dense in a way that would prove difficult for persons new to the study of philosophy in general and Africana philosophy in particular.