An Introduction to Hegel’s Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion

Hegel Phil Religion

Jon Stewart, An Introduction to Hegel’s Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, Oxford University Press, 2022, 277pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192842930.

Reviewed by Reed Winegar, Fordham University


This book provides a highly readable introduction to Hegel’s Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, focused in particular on Hegel’s concern with determinate content in the context of religion. In the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel famously derides philosophers who take the Absolute to be beyond all determination and who, consequently, conceive of the Absolute as “the night in which all cows are black.” Similarly, in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, Hegel criticizes religious views that sap all determinate content from the concept of God. In the Lectures, Hegel aims to overcome such views by presenting the history of religion in terms of the development of the concept of God, a development which Hegel takes to culminate in Christianity’s doctrine of the Trinity. Jon Stewart introduces this aspect of Hegel’s thought in terms of Hegel’s own historical context. More specifically, Stewart focuses on the Lectures’ replies to the Enlightenment and Romantic views that immediately preceded Hegel’s own philosophy. As Stewart notes, Hegel takes Enlightenment thought to yield an overly abstract conception of God that lacks sufficient determinate content, as evidenced by the Deism of thinkers like Voltaire. Hegel also maintains that Romanticism retains this overly abstract conception of God but diminishes the importance of a determinate concept of God for religion. For the Romantics, what really matters in matters of religion is not the determinate content of one’s religious beliefs but, instead, one’s subjective, inner relationship to God, as evidenced by the Romantics’ emphasis on the importance of religious feeling. As Stewart emphasizes, Hegel intends for his own philosophy of religion to overcome the alleged deficiencies of Enlightenment and Romantic religious thought. With this framing, Stewart’s book provides a sympathetic interpretation of Hegel’s attempt to restore determinate content to the concept of God, an attempt that culminates in Hegel’s speculative interpretation of the Christian Trinity. In addition, Stewart introduces readers to several longstanding questions and debates regarding Hegel’s philosophy of religion, including questions and debates over Hegel’s attitudes towards Christology, immortality, Islam, pantheism, and religious pluralism.

This book deserves to be widely read by those interested in gaining further familiarity with the main outlines of Hegel’s views regarding religion. Overall, the book succeeds admirably as an introduction to the main themes of Hegel’s philosophy of religion. It is well-written, well-organized, and clear throughout (which is no small feat given the difficult subject matter). Given the significant historical influence of Hegel’s views regarding religion, such an introduction should prove to be a helpful resource for many people interested in the history of modern religious thought. And while the book’s focus is mainly expository, it is also philosophically sophisticated and sensitive to serious worries about Hegel’s treatment of religion, such as the obvious tension between contemporary commitments regarding religious pluralism and Hegel’s claim that religion reaches its full development in one specific faith—namely, (Protestant) Christianity.

The book is divided into an introduction and nine chapters. In the introduction, Stewart discusses the publication history of the posthumous Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion and presents five main theses that he will aim to defend. These theses are:

  1. “that much of Hegel’s agenda in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion comes from his reaction to the Enlightenment,”
  2. “That a part of Hegel’s project is to correct what he regards as the mistaken form of religious belief in his day” —namely, the Romantic view “that the main thing is that one believes in the strength of one’s inwardness, but the nature of what precisely it is that is believed falls away,”
  3. “that Hegel’s historical account of religion does not end with the birth of Christianity” but that Hegel “also has interesting things to say about religions such as Islam and Deism that appeared after Christianity,”
  4. that the book’s approach to Hegel “casts new light on old controversies from the 1830s and 1840s about the proper interpretation of Hegel’s philosophy of religion in general,” and
  5. “that the basic frame of many of the key issues concerning religion that are discussed today come from Hegel’s time,” such that “a study of his philosophy of religion can afford us insight into discussions in our current academic and cultural context” (19–21).

Chapters 1–2 provide an introduction to Enlightenment theology and philosophy of religion. Here Stewart focuses on Voltaire’s Deism, Hermann Samuel Reimarus’s radical Bible criticism, Lessing’s views regarding revelation and reason, Hume and Kant’s criticisms of theoretical arguments for God’s existence, and Kant’s own concept of moral belief in God. Stewart’s discussion of these figures helps to set up Hegel’s claim that the Enlightenment’s approach to religion culminates in a conception of God that lacks determinate content. Chapter 3 examines Romanticism’s reaction to the Enlightenment, focusing on the Romantics’ turn to inwardness and subjectivity. Here Stewart discusses Rousseau’s theory of inner conscience, Jacobi’s conception of belief in terms of immediate certainty, and Schleiermacher’s emphasis on religious feeling—in particular, the feeling of absolute dependence. Stewart presents Hegel’s general objections to Romanticism as well as Hegel’s more specific objections to Schleiermacher’s treatment of religion.

In chapters 4–6, Stewart turns to the details of Hegel’s own philosophy of religion. Stewart begins in chapter 4 with a general introduction to Hegel’s aims and methods in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, such as Hegel’s aim of restoring content to the concept of God, Hegel’s claim that religion deals with the same content as philosophy but ultimately treats that content in terms of “picture-thinking,” and Hegel’s view that one can observe the development of the concept of God in the history of religious thought, culminating in (Protestant) Christianity. Chapter 5 examines Hegel’s treatments of Judaism and Greco-Roman Polytheism. As Stewart notes, Hegel maintains that Judaism conceives of God as a personal creator but, nevertheless, operates with a conception of God that, in Hegel’s view, “remains too abstract” and, consequently, “leads to a form of religious alienation, whereby God is forever distant and inaccessible to the religious believer” (138). In contrast, Hegel takes Greco-Roman Polytheism to provide a more concrete conception of divinity, exemplified by the representations of the gods in Greek and Roman art. Stewart notes that Hegel values this concreteness but also thinks that this Greek and Roman conception of divinity remains too dependent on nature, as exemplified by the reliance on natural materials like stone in Greek and Roman sculpture. In contrast, Hegel takes Christianity to operate with a concrete moment of divinity, exemplified by the Incarnation, but to also represent spirit as overcoming nature, exemplified by the Son’s resurrection and return to the Father. Chapter 6 focuses in detail on Hegel’s treatment of Christianity. Here Stewart further outlines Hegel’s speculative interpretation of the Trinity. For Hegel, God is incarnated in the Son, who after the Crucifixion is resurrected and returns to the Father. The identity of the Father and Son is then present in the Holy Spirit, which resides in the Christian community. Consequently, Hegel claims that Christianity captures in “picture-thinking” the same development that philosophy captures in terms of the movement from the universal, to the particular, and to the identity of the universal and particular. Here Stewart also discusses Hegel’s preference for Protestantism over Catholicism, given Hegel’s view that Protestantism better corresponds to Spirit’s overcoming of nature.

Chapters 7–9 focus on questions and debates regarding Hegel’s philosophy of religion. Chapter 7 examines the place of Islam in Hegel’s thought. Here Stewart notes that Hegel’s Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion seem to end with Christianity and to ignore later religious developments, such as the rise of Islam. Stewart illustrates Hegel’s own familiarity with and interest in Islam; moreover, Stewart draws on Hegel’s scattered discussions of Islam to argue that Hegel values Islam’s emphasis on thought, as opposed to mere sense, which Hegel takes to be exemplified by Islam’s prohibitions on artistic representations of God. However, Stewart observes that Hegel also maintains that Islam’s conception of divinity remains too abstract in comparison to Christianity’s trinitarian God. Chapter 8 considers three, often intertwined, debates that arose in the immediate aftermath of Hegel’s death concerning the proper interpretation of Hegel’s philosophy of religion. These debates concerned Hegel’s views regarding immortality, pantheism, and Christology. Stewart criticizes the common division of the participants in these debates into the camps of Left and Right Hegelians. Stewart then argues that Hegel himself is committed to an unorthodox conception of immortality that consists of “the ability, by means of thought and reflection, to separate oneself from the contingencies of nature” (212). Stewart also argues that Hegel rejects an impersonal, pantheistic conception of God in favor of a personal, self-conscious God. Finally, Stewart argues that Hegel’s emphasis on the Trinity stresses the importance of Christ and notes that Hegel refers to the historical person Jesus of Nazareth as divine. Chapter 9 concludes the book by considering the legacy of Hegel’s thought in contemporary discussions of religion, including the relationship between Hegel’s thought and contemporary notions of religious pluralism. Here Stewart candidly acknowledges many troubling aspects of Hegel’s thought in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, including Hegel’s Christian chauvinism, his Eurocentrism, and his racism. Stewart insists that the obvious worries concerning these aspects of Hegel’s thought should be taken seriously. However, Stewart also proposes that emphasizing other aspects of Hegel’s thought might allow one to discern an alternate version of Hegel who would be more amenable to contemporary notions of religious pluralism. Here Stewart highlights Hegel’s genuine interest in the specific details of non-Christian religions, Hegel’s claim that religions other than Christianity should not be dismissed as irrational, and Hegel’s view that religions other than Christianity are essential aspects of religion’s overall historical development. In the end, Stewart suggests that one might adapt or revise aspects of Hegel’s own philosophy of religion in service of the contemporary project of Comparative Theology, which advocates that religious believers should study and learn about other religions in the hope of gaining further insight into their own religious traditions.

Overall, this book provides an excellent introduction to the main themes in Hegel’s Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. The book’s discussions of the Enlightenment and Romanticism provide helpful contextualization for Hegel’s thought. The descriptions of Hegel’s own views are remarkably clear and straightforward, and the book also illustrates many of the major questions and debates concerning Hegel’s philosophy of religion. Of course, as an introduction to Hegel’s philosophy of religion, there is only so much that this book can aim to accomplish. For example, the goal of providing a relatively concise introduction to Hegel’s philosophy of religion seems to have required Stewart to omit extended discussion of large sections of Hegel’s Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, such as the details of Hegel’s lengthy discussions of ancient Chinese, Egyptian, Indian, and Middle Eastern religions. Stewart does extensively discuss Hegel’s treatment of these religions elsewhere, such as in his prior book Hegel’s Interpretation of the Religions of the World: The Logic of the Gods. But the present book’s detailed discussions of the history of religion begin with Hegel’s treatments of Judaism and Greco-Roman Polytheism, and the book only gestures at Hegel’s views regarding earlier religious traditions. Similarly, Stewart’s overviews of the debates regarding Hegel’s attitudes towards Islam, immortality, pantheism, Christology, and religious pluralism are illuminating, but each of these topics merits further discussion than would be possible in a concise introduction. Moreover, the book is focused on Hegel’s mature philosophy of religion in the Lectures, and readers hoping to learn about earlier stages of Hegel’s religious thought, such as those found in The Positivity of the Christian Religion and The Spirit of Christianity and its Fate from the 1790s, will need to look elsewhere. Finally, while Stewart is clearly aware of the issue, some readers might like to hear more about how Hegel might aim to reconcile the Lectures’ apparent claim that the historical development of the concept of God culminates with Christianity in a determinate trinitarian conception of God with Hegel’s view that subsequent historical developments in religions, such as Islam, the Enlightenment, and Romanticism, operate with overly abstract conceptions of God. However, even though Stewart is not able to treat all of these issues at length, his introduction to Hegel’s Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion certainly provides readers interested in Hegel’s views with an excellent springboard for pursuing them in further detail.