An Introduction to Indian Philosophy: Perspectives on Reality, Knowledge, and Freedom

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Bina Gupta, An Introduction to Indian Philosophy: Perspectives on Reality, Knowledge, and Freedom, Routledge, 2012, 343pp., $36.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415800037.

Reviewed by John Taber, University of New Mexico


Most will agree that there is no ideal textbook for Indian philosophy. For decades the only useable anthology that one could build a course around has been Radhakrishnan and Moore's A Sourcebook in Indian Philosophy (Princeton, 1967). But it only provides brief summaries of the literature and teachings of the major thought traditions or "schools" (more precisely, "points of view," darśana-s) as introductions to the readings. For a survey of their main doctrines and arguments, many teachers of introductory courses in Indian philosophy still rely on Mysore Hiriyanna's The Essentials of Indian Philosophy, published in 1949, or the even earlier Outlines of Indian Philosophy (1932). The excellent two-volume Geschichte der indischen Philosophie by the great Austrian Indologist Erich Frauwallner, whose problematic political affiliations have recently become a topic of heated discussion, is available in English translation (Motilal Banarsidass, 1973, 1997), but it is an ungainly one. Moreover, Frauwallner's History is incomplete, covering only the Upaniṣads, early Buddhism, Jainism, Sāṃkhya, Yoga, Nyāya, and Vaiśeṣika, and it was originally published a long time ago, too, namely in 1953. Fortunately, his Philosophie des Buddhismus, almost as old (1956) yet still definitive, has now been translated into English under the supervision of Ernst Steinkellner (Motilal Banarsidass, 2010), so that at least we have a comprehensive, reliable guide to Indian Buddhism accompanied by lucid translations of key texts. (Steinkellner's preface to the volume contains his own reflections on Frauwallner's involvement with National Socialism.)

Some more recent surveys of Indian philosophy by Stephen Phillips (Classical Indian Metaphysics [Open Court, 1995]), Jonardon Ganeri (Philosophy in Classical India [Oxford, 2001]), and J. N. Mohanty (Classical Indian Philosophy [Rowman and Littlefield, 2002]), are more focused in scope and tend to treat Indian philosophical ideas from unconventional, though often quite interesting and philosophically sophisticated, perspectives. Richard King's Indian Philosophy: An Introduction to Hindu and Buddhist Thought (Georgetown University, 1999) is also excellent -- nicely written, accurate, and up to date -- but its thematic organization leaves a lot out. Sue Hamilton's Indian Philosophy: A Very Short Introduction (Oxford, 2001) is, well, very short. Thus, a current, comprehensive survey is still needed -- one that covers the entire range of Indian philosophical theories and arguments thoroughly and accurately, is devoid of pedantry, yet at the same time reflects advances in our understanding of Indian thought that have been achieved in the last fifty years.

When one examines Bina Gupta's Introduction to Indian Philosophy, however, one is reminded why most scholars are reluctant to take on such a project. The coverage, to be sure, is comprehensive. It contains chapters on: the Veda, the Upaniṣads, Cārvāka (a materialist tradition), Jainism, early Buddhism, Mīmāṃsā, Sāṃkhya, Yoga, Vaiśeṣika, Nyāya, later Buddhist philosophy (Madhyamaka and Yogācāra; unfortunately, the Buddhist epistemological school of Dignāga and Dharmakīrti is not covered!), Vedānta, the Bhagavad Gītā, and modern Indian thought. There are even several (rather short) sections of translations of selected texts after each main division of the work. It is engagingly and accessibly, if not always elegantly, written. Gupta presents concise, coherent summaries of the main ideas of each tradition. The summaries are interspersed with her own often quite helpful and cogent interpretations and critical reflections. Yet the book is not always accurate. There are some glaring omissions. And it does not take into account some of the most important results of recent scholarship.

Certainly, this is not surprising. The literature of Indian philosophy is vast; very few, if any, scholars have ever mastered it in its entirety, in depth. To access its original texts one must have command of several Asian languages -- not just Sanskrit but also Pali, ardhamāgadhī (the language of early Jain literature), Tibetan, and Chinese (lost Sanskrit texts have been preserved in translation in the latter two). The historical recovery of Indian philosophy is ongoing -- and it is taking place globally, across North America, Europe, and Asia, also in several languages -- with new texts still being discovered, and many of the most important texts hardly deciphered. Any attempt to summarize the thought of even a particular tradition as it is understood in current scholarship would only be a snapshot of an evolving phenomenon. Indeed, many specialists in Indian philosophy today would be loathe to summarize anything beyond just the state of the research in their own sub-disciplines, and would probably express skepticism that we know, collectively, enough at this stage to write a proper history, let alone an introduction to Indian philosophy.

Gupta is to be commended, then, for courageously attempting to meet a legitimate need. Her book will no doubt be widely used and will give many students access to a field of study that otherwise would have been closed to them. For the purposes for which it is intended, it need not be a definitive work of scholarship -- most of its users will not notice or care that it is not accurate at the highest degree of resolution, so to speak. But it is a reviewer's duty to point out shortcomings, if for no other reason than to alert those working in the field to the challenges of such an undertaking. (We are constantly being tempted by publishers. If I had ten dollars for every time one approached me about writing an introductory text, I would by now have enough to take my wife out to dinner at a very nice restaurant.)

I shall focus just on Gupta's presentation of Sāṃkhya, Chapter Eight, pp. 130-143. This will allow me to discuss her treatment of one of the traditions in depth. The sorts of criticisms I develop here can be extended to the rest of the book.

The chapter begins with an overview of Sāṃkhya literature, which contains a couple of mistakes and, though it is obviously intended to be brief, some surprising omissions. Gupta mentions two works as traditionally attributed to the legendary founder of the school, Kapila: the Sāṃkhyasūtra and the Sāṃkhyapravacanasūtra. But these are two names of the same work, and although it is indeed traditionally ascribed to Kapila, scholars agree that it is late, belonging to the fourteenth or fifteenth century. She also identifies Vijñānabhikṣu's Sāṃkhyapravacanabhāṣya as a commentary on Īśvarakṛṣṇa's Sāṃkhyakārikā when, as the title itself suggests, it is a commentary on the Sāṃkhyapravacanasūtra (a.k.a. Sāṃkhyasūtra). In listing the "most important" commentaries on the Sāṃkhyakārikā (henceforth SK), on which she bases her presentation, she leaves out the Yuktidīpikā, which is the oldest (ca. seventh century C.E.), the most extensive, and the best source of information about the diversity of views among the adherents of Sāṃkhya in classical times. She says nothing about the Ṣaṣṭitantra, a very influential but lost treatise (preserved only in fragments cited by other authors; its theory of knowledge was reconstructed in a famous article by Frauwallner published in 1958), to which the SK itself refers as its archetype in its final verse. Gupta also, in her short historical overview, refers to Kapila as "an atheist." Indeed, the SK and many of the other preserved texts of Sāṃkhya do not recognize God as first cause of the universe or savior. But she should have mentioned that alongside the non-theistic tradition of Sāṃkhya there was a theistic strain that extends all the way back to the Upaniṣads.

The presentation of the main teachings of the system is straightforward. Indeed, a no-nonsense, factual approach is one of the appealing aspects of the book. Gupta seems to consider Sāṃkhya primarily a metaphysical system.

The Sāṃkhya school attempts to provide an intelligible account of our experiences in the world. Our everyday experiences consist of the experiencer and the experienced, the subject and the object. The subject and the object, puruṣa [the self] and prakṛiti [primal matter; Gupta however prefers "nature"], are distinct; one cannot be reduced to the other. The Sāṃkhya metaphysics is thus based on the bi-polar nature of our daily experiences. We experience a plurality of objects. How do these objects come about? What is the ultimate cause of these objects? Cause is always finer and subtler than the effects. Thus, there must be a cause, some stuff that underlies the entire world of objects. Such a cause is prakṛti; it is the first uncaused cause of all objects, gross and subtle. (p. 130)

She then proceeds to outline: the proof of the "unmanifest" state of prakṛti, matter in its original, undifferentiated state, which is the source of the cosmos; the proof of the distinctive Sāṃkhya theory of immanent causation or "the doctrine of the [pre-]existence of the effect in its cause" (satkāryavāda); the theory of the dynamic qualities or constituents (guṇa-s) that comprise matter and are responsible for change; the proof of the existence of a self, which of course the Buddhists contested, and the proof of a plurality of selves, which diverges from the Upaniṣadic teaching of one universal self; and the transformation or "evolution" of matter into the world as we know it. A concluding section treats the Sāṃkhya theory of the means of knowledge (pramāṇa-s).

What this sort of approach, which presents Sāṃkhya as a collection of metaphysical and epistemological doctrines, leaves out is the fundamental soteriological orientation of Sāṃkhya. The opening verses of the SK declare in effect that the purpose of the treatise is to alleviate "the threefold suffering" (internal, external, and supernatural), since none of the usual means, neither the "visible" ones such as the pursuit of pleasure, the use of medicines, and so forth, nor even "scriptural" ones, such as the performance of Vedic rituals, really works. That is to say, none of them removes one altogether from the cycle of rebirth. (Transmigration was one thing Sāṃkhya did not feel it needed to prove, since it was almost universally accepted across Indian religio-philosophical traditions.) Sāṃkhya, however, will do that by delivering the knowledge of the essential nature of the self, prakṛti, and their difference -- most importantly, knowledge of the fact that the self is not the individual complex of body and cognitive faculties with which it falsely identifies, but the inactive "witness," pure consciousness. (A striking corollary of this realization is that the self is not an agent of any kind nor even a knower.)

In short, Sāṃkhya is part of the ancient tradition already evident in the Upaniṣads (but even early Buddhism can be understood in this light) that held that a certain kind of theoretical knowledge is the only means of salvation. That knowledge, specifically, is not only of the essence of the self (or, in the case of Buddhism, of the lack thereof) but also of the world to which the self stands in contrast. To be sure, Gupta covers the views of Sāṃkhya as well as other darśana-s about the nature of bondage and liberation -- and in the case of Sāṃkhya she does a particularly good job expounding the central metaphors for the interaction of puruṣa and prakṛti: the lame man and the blind man, the dancer who exits the stage when she realizes she has been "seen" by the audience, and so on. But she treats them as if they were on a par with other metaphysical and epistemological doctrines when they actually, not only in Sāṃkhya but also at least in Nyāya and Vedānta among the Brahminical traditions, had a more basic function: they were definitive of the very intent of philosophical reflection.

Her treatments of the inferences of prakṛti, the satkāryavāda, the self, and the plurality of selves, which make up the heart of the "system," leave much to be desired. Her translations, or paraphrases, of the verses in which the inferences are presented make Īśvarakṛṣṇa sound like an idiot: they are either unintelligible or sound wildly implausible. Her own explanations help, but she would have done better to follow the interpretations of the commentaries more closely. Vācaspatimiśra, author of the Tattvakaumudī commentary (tenth century), and the anonymous author of the Yuktidīpikā knew that these arguments were coming under attack from philosophers outside Sāṃkhya, so they did their best to formulate them as rigorously as possible.

But Gupta also seems not to appreciate the historical significance of these arguments, or of the philosophical project of Sāṃkhya in general. This is where I think she would have especially profited from consideration of recent research. Sāṃkhya was really something like a grand experiment in rationalism. Abandoning the prophetic style of discourse of the Upaniṣads and early Buddhism, it actually believed it could demonstrate the basic principles of its world-view. The point of enumerating the means of knowledge (pramāṇa-s) at the beginning of the treatise is not to define them per se (as was the preoccupation in Nyāya) but to determine their limits: much of what cannot be apprehended through perception can be known by inference, and what cannot be known through inference can be known by scripture. But inference, especially a particular kind of inference referred to as "inference according to a general characteristic" (sāmānyato dṛṣṭaṃ anumānam), which is akin to inference from analogy, can tell us about supersensible reality: that there is a first cause of everything and that it is material in nature; that there is a self, and so on. (The key arguments for the existence of prakṛiti and puruṣa are applications of this kind of inference; Gupta does not bring this out, either.) Thus, scripture, to which lip-service is paid by mentioning it among the pramāṇa-s so that Sāṃkhya can identify itself as a "Vedic" teaching (even though, as we saw, it rejects Vedic ritualism), is rarely resorted to. The pioneering research on Sāṃkhya by Frauwallner has shown that Sāṃkhya probably owes this orientation to the Ṣaṣṭitantra, which was one of the founding works of Indian epistemology and a major influence on the Buddhist epistemologist Dignāga.

It is Sāṃkhya's commitment to reason, then, that makes its lapses in reasoning -- besides some rather flimsy arguments, incoherencies and outright inconsistencies, which other philosophers were quick to point out -- so fascinating. Gupta discusses some of these. How can prakṛti, which is unconscious, transform itself "for the sake of the puruṣa," providing not only a body and faculties for it but a field of objects that yield pleasurable and painful experiences, as if sensing what it needs to progress towards eventual liberation? Gupta is right to emphasize the fact that Sāṃkhya was the only Indian philosophical tradition that recognized teleology in nature, but it is very different from Aristotle's. It is not a teleology that just guides individual processes for the sake of ends within nature (say, the survival of a certain species of animal), but one that guides natural processes for the sake of the soteriological ends of beings outside of nature!

Another puzzle is: how can the self, which unlike Descartes' ego is not a thinking substance but pure consciousness without activity, "mistake" the living organism for itself and thereby become bound in the cycle of rebirth? Yet another one, more on the order of an incoherency: are the various transformations of prakṛti -- buddhi (intellect), ego, the senses, mind, and organs of action, the sensible qualities, and finally the elements -- to be understood as stages in the formation of the entire cosmos at creation or stages in the formation of an individual living being? (Gupta seems to think that they can be looked at either way, both in their "cosmic aspect" and their "psychological aspect," but where is she getting this?) Although it somehow, around the beginning of the fourth century (the date of the Ṣaṣṭitantra), resolved to commit itself to rational investigation -- and one of the topics of recent research on Sāṃkhya has been to try to explain why -- Sāṃkhya had inherited many teachings over the centuries that it could not easily jettison, so that an unusual hybrid arose. Indeed, rationalism in India never had its Cartesian moment, a complete clearing of the decks and starting over (if that is in fact what Descartes did).

Finally, Gupta's insistence that Sāṃkhya was not a materialist philosophy seems muddled. She writes, "the distinction between the subjective and the objective is a distinction within prakṛti, and prakṛti is not to be understood purely physicalistically" (p. 133). This is misleading. The "distinction between the subjective and the objective" within prakṛti to which Gupta is alluding is probably the distinction between "gross" physical matter, the "elements" (mahābhūta-s), and the various cognitive faculties (buddhi, ego, mind, and senses), all of which arise from matter in its original unmanifest, undifferentiated state. But the SK says explicitly that all of the transformations of prakṛti, including the various faculties, are "possessed of the three guṇa-s" (again, the guṇa-s are the dynamic constituents of matter that account for change), "unconscious" ("like a pot"), "an object" (viṣaya), "general" (interpreted to mean intersubjectively available), and "productive" (giving rise to other things), all of which properties it shares with prakṛti (kā. 11); that is, they are all material in nature. That Sāṃkhya is not materialism has to do, rather, with the positing of a distinct immaterial conscious principle, namely, a self, which is completely "separate" from prakṛti and its transformations, including senses, mind, and intellect, and which has all the opposite properties. The whole point of Sāṃkhya, as explained above, is to realize this. One of the interesting implications of this scheme is that Sāṃkhya conceived of mental states as changes in these faculties. Since the latter are material in nature, it seems it would not be incorrect to say that for Sāṃkhya cognition is a physical event. Consciousness, meanwhile, is not a real property of a cognitive faculty but only an apparent one, due to the "reflection" of the consciousness of the self in it. How such reflection can occur is another of the unexplained mysteries of Sāṃkhya.

Ninety-five percent of what Gupta writes in her An Introduction to Indian Philosophy is correct. Only specialists will be concerned about the other five percent. As explained, this has to do partly with the rapidly evolving picture of Indian philosophy in current research. But specialists are not the intended audience of the book.