An Unprecedented Deformation: Marcel Proust and the Sensible Ideas

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Mauro Carbone, An Unprecedented Deformation: Marcel Proust and the Sensible Ideas, Niall Keane (tr.), SUNY Press, 2010, 128pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438430218.

Reviewed by Gert-Jan van der Heiden, Radboud University Nijmegen


According to Maurice Merleau-Ponty, our epoch is marked by the struggle to overcome the famous Platonic distinction between the sensible and the intelligible, and this struggle can be seen first and foremost in art and literature. In the words of Mauro Carbone, professor of aesthetics at the University of Milan: our epoch aims at "a different description of the relationship between the sensible and the intelligible" and thus at "a new theory of ideas" (p. 9). In discussion with Merleau-Ponty and Gilles Deleuze, Carbone's book offers such a new theory in which the concept of the sensible idea occupies a central place.

The notion of the sensible idea sounds as a contradictio in adiecto to the Platonic ear, but it is exactly this notion that in contemporary reversals of Platonism plays a crucial role. To understand what this notion means, An Unprecedented Deformation takes as its point of departure the famous passage from Marcel Proust's novel À la Recherche du temps perdu in which the narrator Marcel is taken back by the scent of the "petites madeleines" to his past experiences of Combray. The aesthetic shock that Marcel experiences here is exemplary for what a sensible idea is. Carbone develops this concept in discussion with both Merleau-Ponty, who sets out to "retrieve a thought of the sensible idea in the work of Proust," and Deleuze, whose effort to reverse Platonism results in an account of the relationship between the sensible and the intelligible in which the form is not simply given before and beyond its sensible appearance, but always already in and with "its own sensible deformations" (p. 10).

Carbone starts this project with a reflection on the final lecture notes of Merleau-Ponty. In the first chapter, he reconstructs the new ontology that can be traced in these final notes. A crucial notion in this respect is the notion of voyance (clairvoyance). Although this voyance renders present what is absent (p. 17), Carbone takes great care to distinguish it from a second sight in the Platonic sense of the word: voyance is "not a 'second sight' directed to the intelligible, but rather a vision that sees the invisible in the visible" (p. 19). Of course, it remains to be seen in which sense Merleau-Ponty's invisible seen in the visible can indeed be distinguished from its Platonic counterpart. At this point, the sensible idea comes into play. What the voyance sees is a sensible idea, that is, "a 'dimension' which opens up simultaneously with our encounter with its samples, thus offering to us an anticipation of knowledge which 'can never again be closed'" (p. 20). This difficult quote beautifully illustrates what is at stake in the notion of the sensible idea for Carbone. First of all, the sensible idea is an idea, that is, the voyance is a Wesensschau: it perceives an intelligible essence beyond the mere existence of the sensible. In the second place, this idea is nowhere given but in its samples. This of course raises the question to what extent different samples present the same idea. The remarkable answer to this question is given only in the third chapter but concerns the topic the title of the book promises: unprecedented deformations. In the third place, the sensible idea is somewhat enigmatically described in terms of the anticipation of a certain knowledge.

This latter dimension of the sensible idea, which remains unexplored in the first chapter, is elaborated in the second. The anticipation of a knowledge which "can never again be closed" refers us back to the temporal a priori structure of the sensible idea. Somehow, the sensible idea opens up a past, like the past opened up by the involuntary memory of Combray. This past, as Merleau-Ponty argues, is not an ordinary past but concerns a mythical time. Thus, we see that the sensible idea is not grounded in a Platonic recollection that places this idea "in a Platonistic eternity" (p. 27). This mythical time rather shows "the eternal in the ephemeral." This encounter with the ephemeral that gives birth to the eternal thus gives rise to a knowledge which "can never again be closed." Carbone beautifully shows that a similar structure can be discerned in Deleuze's account of Marcel's memory of Combray. Also, Deleuze describes this memory as a memory of a past that was never present and as "an ancient mythical present."

Only in the third chapter, in Carbone's account of Deleuze's reversal of Plato, does the difficult concept of mythical time become clearer. In this chapter, Carbone addresses the important theme of deformation. By now, it will come as no surprise that this discussion also sets out a discussion of Plato's notions of idea and eidos, or form. In the Platonic conception of art, all art, as it is imitative, is a deformation since the work of art always falls short of its Idea. Carbone notices that this provides us with a remarkable ontological parallel between Plato's condemnation of art and the way in which twentieth-century art understands its own activity. In twentieth-century art, deformation is not an unwanted side-effect of artistic creation but comes to be seen as the basic work of the artist. As such, works of art have become "adventures of deformation" (p. 34). Here we truly see what Deleuze's reversal of Platonism involves. In Platonism, deformation should be avoided since Platonism offers us an access to the form that does not require these deformations. The notion of the sensible idea, on the other hand, indicates that "an idea … can be given only together [with] and through these very deformations" (p. 37). Since, in this latter conception, the idea is "un-presentable," it is only given "simultaneously with its deformations, which constitute it as their excess" (p. 38). Thus, deformation becomes the condition of possibility of the form and of the recognition of any essence. More precisely, recognition of the form or the essence can only be thought of as an activity that exceeds that which manifests itself. As Carbone notices, this is of crucial importance to understand what happens in artistic creation:

Ascertaining the excess-character of essence, in relation to the manifestations that constitute it, entails acknowledging the creativity which is at work in the recognition of essence, that is, the creativity at work in the memory which produces such a recognition. (pp. 39-40)

This indicates how recognition and memory are related. The creativity at work in the recognition of an essence produces something which at the same time is "retro-jected, as a model, into a mythical past" (p. 40). Clearly, this means that in the relation between essence and deformation, deformations are prior. On the basis of deformations and creativity, an essence can be recognized by being retro-jected into the mythical past as a model. Although Derrida is remarkably absent from Carbone's book, it is clear that what Carbone finds here in Deleuze is basically Derrida's original doubling that already guides his account of mimesis in the essays of La dissémination. Derrida's mimesis, like Carbone's deformation, precedes the recognition of an essence. Yet, unlike Derrida, Carbone never addresses the question of what this means for the notions of form and essence. Derrida would argue that mimesis as a condition of possibility of form and essence is at the same time their condition of impossibility. Perhaps the absence of Derrida from the book -- he is mentioned only once -- is symptomatic for Carbone's lack of attention to these Derridean questions concerning the status of form and essence when they do not precede but are preceded by mimesis and deformation. To a certain extent, this is a pity because, as the title of the book indicates, the unprecedented deformations are its central theme.

The fourth chapter deals with the relation between Merleau-Ponty and psychoanalysis. This chapter seems to discuss the central topic of the sensible idea only in an aside, and therefore it is not entirely clear what function it has in the book as a whole. Nevertheless, Carbone returns to the sensible idea and its unprecedented deformation in the fifth and final chapter by means of the problem of recognition. Here the source of inspiration is again Plato. In this case, it is the problem of the dialogue Meno: how can one recognize what one did not know? The relation between Mnemosyne and Lethe -- remembering and forgetting -- allows Carbone to deal with this question. As the mother of the muses, Mnenosyne grants the poet "the privilege of being present to this past, which is inaccessible to all but the poet, who, therefore, is entrusted with a 'direct, personal vision' of it" (p. 63). Hence, thanks to the forgetting of all people (including the poet), Mnemosyne can grant the poet access to a past that, due to this forgetting, has turned into an immemorial past. Or, in terms employed in the rest of Carbone's book, it is on the basis of forgetting that remembrance springs from a creativity that retro-jects its product in a mythical past. This thus leads to the following account of the Ideas:

Ideas, that is, created through difference and not through imitation of preliminary models, ideas that can only arrive, as Deleuze showed, at being recognized as models… . it is this recognition that the art and literature of the twentieth century appear to have explored. (p. 67)

Also, the themes of this fifth chapter have a definite Derridean ring to them. Nevertheless, Derrida only appears once in the book. As noted above, this is a pity since the question of an unprecedented deformation belongs to Derrida's thought as well and he addresses some questions with respect to this issue that go unnoticed in Carbone's book. Perhaps a starting point in the more well-known Derridean treatment of this discussion might also have helped the book in another respect. From the very first page, the reader enters a difficult, technical discussion which is not always easy to follow. A more moderate beginning by means of discussing the state of affairs in relation to the reversal of Platonism in contemporary thought and in relation to themes that resemble the central idea of a deformation without any preceding form might have helped the reader to access the book more easily. Despite these remarks, it needs to be emphasized that the technical discussion of Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze is very interesting and well elaborated, and Carbone succeeds in providing a promising, new conception of the sensible idea.