Analogia Entis: On The Analogy of Being, Metaphysics, and the Act of Faith

Placeholder book cover

Steven A. Long, Analogia Entis: On The Analogy of Being, Metaphysics, and the Act of Faith, University of Notre Dame Press, 2011, 146pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268034122.

Reviewed by Thomas M. Osborne Jr., University of St. Thomas, Houston


Long's short book is an engaging defense of his version of the once traditional Thomistic view that being is analogous most importantly by an analogy of proportionality. His defense of the centrality of proper proportionality for metaphysics and natural theology aligns him with many of the greatest Thomists of the mid-twentieth century, such as ReginaldGarrigou-Lagrange, James Anderson, Jacques Maritain, and Yves Simon, as well as a longer Thomist tradition that reaches back to Thomas de Vio Cajetan and his sources. Adherents hold that their view both is a historically accurate interpretation of Thomas and philosophically correct. This approach is now almost universally rejected by scholars andThomists, who generally hold that Thomas in his mature theory discards the analogy of proper proportionality in metaphysics and natural theology, and embraces the exclusive use of a kind of analogy of attribution (Wippel 2000, pp. 65-93). Joshua Hochschild (2010) has published a defense of Cajetan's semantic theory of analogy in its historical context. Long is relatively unconcerned with semantic and historical issues. His book is a welcome attempt to defend the importance of proper proportionality for understanding being.

For Thomists who follow Cajetan, a key distinction is between the analogies of attribution and proportionality. According to the analogy of attribution, sometimes now called a pros hen analogy or an analogy of proportion, the primary analogate's meaning is included in the meanings of other analogate terms. For instance, the meaning of the term "healthy," when predicated of both medicine and urine, includes a reference to an animal's health. The analogy of proportionality is when two terms are related to each other in proportionally the same way that two other terms are related to each other. For instance, sight is related to the mind in the same way that understanding is related to the intellect. According to a strong Thomistic tradition, substances and accidents are most importantly beings according to the analogy of proportionality, insofar as substance and accidents have diverse relationships to being (esse). A substance's relationship to its being, which is being in itself (esse in se), is proportionally the same as an accident's relationship to its being, which is being in another (esse in alio). Similarly, "wisdom" can be predicated of God both by attribution, insofar as he is a cause of wisdom, as well as by proportionality, according to which a creature's act of knowing the highest causes is similar by proportionality to God's act of knowing the highest causes. In the same way, a creature is called a "being" not only insofar as his being is caused by God, but more importantly by proper proportionality, insofar as the creature is related to its being in proportionally the same way as God is related to his own being.

In his Introduction, Long endorses Cajetan's position and connects it with a metaphysical understanding of act and potency. Nevertheless, he at times seems to depart from Cajetan'sapproach. For instance, Cajetan gives a semantic account of analogous predication that can be used in metaphysics. Long is unclear about semantic issues. Moreover, perhaps because of this difference, Long seems to give an alternative account to what Thomists call "mixed analogy." According to Cajetan and many Thomists, an analogous term is denominated intrinsically only by the analogy of proportionality. In the analogy of attribution, secondary analogates are predicated by extrinsic denomination. For instance, the term "healthy" is predicated by intrinsic denomination only of an animal, the primary analogate, but it is predicated by extrinsic denomination of such secondary analogates as medicine and urine. In the analogy of proportionality, both primary and secondary analogates are denominated intrinsically, as for instance not just substances but also accidents are said to be "beings" in their own right, and not merely by reference to some extrinsic being. This intrinsic denomination is possible because the secondary analogates are conceived of as having a proportional relationship to the primary analogates. In this example, the accident is to the accident's being as a substance is to the substance's being.

One obvious problem for this position that accidents are beings by proportionality is that both Aristotle and Thomas say that an accident is a being according to an analogy of attribution or pros hen ordering to substance. Cajetan and similar Thomists respond that this is a kind of "mixed" analogy which can be considered both according to attribution and proportionality. When predicated according to the analogy of proportionality, "being" is predicated of the accident formally and by intrinsic denomination. But insofar as "being" can also be predicated of an accident according to the analogy of attribution, i.e., when we call an accident a being only because it is somehow related to the being of substance, "being" is predicated of the accident by extrinsic denomination, that is by reference to the being of substance. Cajetan invokes a formal/material distinction to clarify that the rule about analogy of attribution denominating secondary analogates extrinsically is a rule about the semantic properties of the term as applied to the thing, and not about the nature of theanalogate itself.

Long, in his Introduction, mentions Anderson's discussion of this mixed analogy, but he states that, "While Anderson speaks of formal proportionality and material proportion, I prefer the language of De veritate regarding 'transferred proportion' as a proportion that necessarily must be expressible in the terms of proper proportionality: but it is the same insight" (9). What does Long mean by "transferred proportion"? His description of the relevant text seems to be only mentioned in a later discussion, when he translates De veritate, q. 23, art. 7, ad 9 (p. 50). In this text Thomas notes that there is some sort of proportion between human goods, which is either 1) an indeterminate proportion from the fact that humans are made by and subject to God, or 2) something resulting from the likeness between the proportion of the finite subject and property and that of the infinite subject and property. Long here and throughout the book uses this passage to argue that an analogy of attribution must be somehow reduced or transferred or translated to the analogy of proportionality. He does not describe what this means, and the connection between Thomas' text and mixed analogy seems tenuous. Long states,

in the general sense of any relationship of one thing to another, and ruling out any real relation of God to creature or determination of God in relation to the creature, one may in this transferred sense affirm analogy of proportion as, as it were, virtually contained within the analogy of proper proportionality (p. 94).

The most charitable interpretation is that Long is merely saying that in order for an analogous term to be predicated by intrinsic denomination, then it must be predicable by the analogy of proportionality and not only by the analogy of attribution. The indeterminate proportion would necessarily lead to an analogy of proper proportionality. It seems to me that Long's position on "transference" or "translation" might at least be defensible on this interpretation, but his text is unclear to me. Long might also mean to say that the causal relationship is always one-to-another, that this causal one-to-another analogy is always an analogy of attribution, and that the analogy of attribution is always rooted in the analogy of proper proportionality. It does not seem to me that he has fully established these theses. I discuss this issue as an instance of the difficulty in interpreting Long's meaning.

It is important to remember that Long is concerned not so much with the analogous predication of "being," as with the analogy of being (analogia entis). In Chapter One, he emphasizes that although the analogy of being is metaphysically rooted in the causation of created being by God, our knowledge of being starts with limited created being, which is divided by potency and act (23). This division between potency and act is an instance of proper proportionality. This diversity of being explains how there can be multiple beings even though being is not a genus. Long makes an interesting claim that being would not be univocal even if there were only one being (25). He is surely right if he is supposing that the being is a created substance, since it would be divided between act and potency, substance and accidents.

In Chapter Two, Long discusses two classic early texts by Thomas. In 1 Sent., d. 19, q. 5, art. 2, ad 1, Thomas distinguishes between three kinds of analogy: 1) an analogy that is logically univocal but contains really diverse members, such as the genus of body, which includes corruptible and incorruptible bodies, 2) an analogy that has one notion which is diversely participated, such as the description of medicine and an animal as "healthy," and 3) an analogy which contains diverse notions and beings, such as the description of both God and creatures as "good" or "true." The purpose of distinguishing 2) and 3) seems to be to explain the difference between the extrinsic and intrinsic predication of analogous terms. Cajetan had mapped this distinction onto another distinction in De veritate, q. 2, art. 11, according to which one kind of analogy has a determinate proportion, namely what Cajetan calls the analogy of attribution or proportion, and another kind has no determinate proportion, namely what Cajetan calls the analogy of proportionality. The latter can be used for predicating terms of God. Most Thomists now believe that Cajetan's mapping of one distinction on the other is inaccurate, and that the De veritate represents only a youthful position that is later rejected. In Chapter Three, Long defends Cajetan's connection of these texts against three selected early critics, namely Bernard Montagnes, Ralph McInenry, and GeorgeKlubertanz.

It seems to me that the most important objections to Cajetan's proper proportionality are raised by Klubertanz (1960). Long opens the chapter with a section on Klubertanz'shistorical objections, and ends with a section on his systematic objections. The two sets of objections are related. Klubertanz's historical point is that Thomas mentions proper proportionality to describe how terms are predicated of God only relatively early in the De veritate. In later texts Thomas uses the analogy of proportion or attribution to speak about God. Consequently, he seems to reject the very position which he had defended earlier. Second, Klubertanz argues that proper proportionality is only about predication, whereas the analogy of proportion or attribution is based on the causal relationship of creatures to God. In response, Long points out that "being" and indeed all the pure perfections are not predicated of God merely causally; they signify his substance, however imperfectly. The analogy of proportion, since it is based on this causal relationship, cannot fully account for such predication.

Against Klubertanz's historical claim, Long makes the salient point that the historical argument seems to be an argument from silence, since Thomas never explicitly rejects the Deveritate account. With respect to Thomas' later use of proportion for describing the analogy of God and creatures, Long argues that these texts do not clearly contradict the Deveritate, since Thomas often distinguishes a determinate from an indeterminate proportion between creatures and God. In the De veritate, he merely states that there is no determinate proportion, and in his later writings he discusses an indeterminate proportion. Long could strengthen his argument by analyzing the later texts (Summa contra gentiles 4.12 andSumma Theologiae I-II, q. 3, art. 5, ad 1) in which Thomas seems to imply that analogy of proper proportionality is best for predicating terms of creatures and God by intrinsic attribution.

Both Long and Klubertanz seem to think that Thomas either 1) rejected his earlier view that there is no predication of divine names by proportion, or 2) is consistently committed to the view that the only analogous predication by intrinsic denomination is by proper proportionality. An alternative view is put forth by Santiago Ramirez in his magisterial four-volume work De analogia (Ramirez 1970, vol. 3, pp. 1488-1496). Ramirez shows that the proportion rejected in the De veritate is only a proportion in the more narrow sense. Nevertheless, Ramirez also convincingly argues that in a wider sense there can be both an analogy of proportion with intrinsic denomination as well as analogy of proportion with extrinsic denomination. This position is based on Thomas' texts and also an independent argument that the division between the kinds of analogy in the Sentences commentary should not be mapped on to the division in the De veritate (Ramirez 1970, vol. 4, 1811-1850). Given Long's classical proclivities, it is strange that he does not consider Ramirez's work, which is in large part prior to and much more complete than that of Klubertanz. In short, Long's argument for the exclusive value of proper proportionality to a great extent works against Klubertanz, but it insufficiently supports his own view.

In Chapter Four, Long reiterates the traditional point that the analogy of proper proportionality is the most important kind of analogy for natural theology and revelation. He emphasizes that pure perfections do not signify any causal relation between God and creatures. He connects these points with the act of faith. It seems to me that Long could strengthen his argument by addressing more explicitly the distinction between signifying God's substance and signifying a relation or negation. In an Appendix, Long makes some short remarks on how the concept of being is abstracted. He criticizes both those who think that the subject of metaphysics is attained only when the existence of immaterial beings is demonstrated as well as existential Thomists who reject Cajetan's doctrine of the three degrees of abstraction.

This book is significant because it is one of the few contemporary attempts to defend what was the mainstream Thomist position for nearly five centuries, Cajetan's understanding of analogous naming. The main drawbacks are that the argument is often abbreviated and confusing, the logical or semantic issues are neglected, and the scholarship should be stronger. In particular, it is hard to evaluate the metaphysical issues without also considering the many semantic issues. With respect to scholarship, there are two major points. First, Long does not mention the important work of Jennifer Ashworth and Gyula Klima, and only in passing mentions Joshua Hochschild. Second, the citations of Thomas Aquinas are to whatever is included in the online Corpus Thomisticum rather than to the Leonine or best critical editions, with their accompanying notes and apparatus. Despite these imperfections, Long's book is a stimulating contemporary defense of the traditional Cajetanian doctrine of analogy, which itself is an important and rare achievement.[1]


Hochschild, Joshua (2010). The Semantics of Analogy: Reading Cajetan's De Nominum Analogia. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.

Klubertanz, George P (1960). St. Thomas Aquinas on Analogy. Chicago: Loyola University Press.

Ramirez, Iacobus Maria (1970). De analogia. 4 vols. Madrid: Instituto de Filosofia "Luis Vives."

Wippel, John F. The Metaphysical Thought of Thomas Aquinas: From Finite Being to Uncreated Being (2000). Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press.

[1] Special thanks to Joshua Hochschild and Domenic D'Ettore for discussion on these issues, and to Steven A. Long for clarification on some points.