Analytic Philosophy and History of Philosophy

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Tom Sorrell and G. A. J. Rogers, (eds.), Analytic Philosophy and History of Philosophy. Oxford University Press, 2005, 240pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199278997.

Reviewed by J. B. Schneewind, Johns Hopkins University


The substantial amount of good English-language work on the history of philosophy published in the past few decades provides an appropriate occasion for the present volume. Analytic philosophers still dominate the main Anglophone departments; and they are famed, or ill famed, for ignoring the history of their subject. In his Introduction to the present volume, Tom Sorrell notes that analytic philosophers use historical texts for teaching, and write about them, concentrating on the arguments in them rather than on their historical settings. Nonetheless he thinks that on the whole analytic philosophy is "not only unhistorical but anti-historical and hostile to textual commentary." (1) Is there reason to think that analytic philosophers should care more about history of philosophy or would benefit from reading more about it? Seven of the volume's ten essays offer answers to this question. The remaining three contributions stand apart from it. G.A.J. Rogers illuminatingly compares Locke and Wittgenstein on philosophy as therapy centering on clarifying language. M. R. Ayers presents a careful study of the thought of Richard Burthogge. Steven Nadler argues convincingly that to understand Spinoza on immortality we need to see the political ramifications of his view in his own time. All three are fine pieces; but I'll take up only the seven essays that address the book's central topic.

Anthony Kenny rejects the view that progress in philosophy shows in an increase in knowledge, leading up to the systematic truth discovered by the historian's favorite thinker -- perhaps himself. He also denies that philosophy is an art, created, like literature, by geniuses whose work is never obsolete. There can be progress in philosophy, Kenny holds, but it is piecemeal, coming as solutions to specific problems or the dissolution of certain confusions. Philosophy produces not knowledge but understanding, an organizing of what is known. It is so hard to do this well that outstanding works of the past are always helpful. We pursue the same goals as Plato and Aristotle, using similar methods. If we understand past thought as philosophy, it can always be helpful in our own quest for understanding.

John Cottingham rightly says that large amounts of current Anglophone philosophy are in fact commentary on texts of varying degrees of antiquity. So it is absurd to suppose that analytic philosophy does not use the past. If we studied history more fully, however, we could use it to gain new perspectives on our own work. Of course we must think for ourselves. But when we really study someone like Descartes and see how complex and systematic his own thinking was -- he was not just an "epistemologist" -- we become aware of the incompleteness of our own views. We also uncover assumptions we make without being aware that we make them. Descartes, for instance, was deeply concerned with theological issues that we assume are not pertinent to philosophical work. Philosophers are supposed to reflect on their own activity. Philosophical thinking, unlike science, is deeply tangled in past formulations of problems. We need historical study to become more fully reflective and self-aware than we are.

Tom Sorrell argues that the problem-solving orientation of analytic philosophy itself gives us reason to study history. He rejects any blanket claim that there are no perennial philosophical problems. Only history can tell whether there are or not. And if we are still working on old problems, then history of philosophy can be useful to philosophical problem-solvers. Past thinkers approached issues in ways that can be instructive even if not now wholly satisfactory. But it often takes historical study to open this work to today's thinkers. History would be irrelevant, Sorrell says, if philosophy were only concerned with interpreting results of science or seeking to synthesize these. But Anglophone philosophy has never been confined to these two endeavors.

Sorrell usefully points out the importance of history in introducing philosophy to beginners. No one, he thinks, could object to including Aristotle and Sidgwick on reading lists for an introductory ethics course. Even very old texts speak to today's students, as much as contemporary writings do. For instance current discussions of impersonality in ethical theory show that ancient Greek thought is still pertinent to our problems. Historical reading is useful in teaching students how to read and criticize philosophical texts. It helps to bring out the characteristically dialectical nature of philosophy, and shows the origins of many of the positions that analytic philosophers still discuss. But history must fit in with the dominant non-historical work of philosophers.

Catherine Wilson reminds us that on one view history of philosophy helps problem-solvers because it shows up confusions and muddles in past work like their own. Since this will not lure them to history, Wilson looks for more enticing reasons to study the subject. Philosophy, she thinks, is properly concerned "with the re-processing of experiential and scientific truth … into intuitively graspable pictures." (63-4) Early modern philosophers developed ways to do this. Their efforts can be helpful even if their science is now outdated.

Work in history of philosophy, Wilson says, has moved past reclaiming "transmissible wisdom", past reviving distinctions and arguments, and on to contextualized studies of belief systems. It has also become a philosophical sub-specialty. As such it gives rise to difficulties in persuading problem-solving departments to hire its experts, who seem harder to talk to than problem-solving colleagues. (Wilson does not consider the pervasive fragmentation of sub-specialties in philosophy, and the fact that few of us can or even try to keep up with all the major fields.) Historians learn more from analysts than the other way round, Wilson suggests, but philosophers cannot process scientific data unless they have some framework for doing so. And history is a major source of exemplary frameworks. Philosophers, particularly moral philosophers, need to do more with scientific data. They, it seems, are particularly in need of the help history can give.

Gary Hatfield's judicious and wide-ranging essay is the most substantial piece in the volume. Surveying work in history of philosophy written during the last century, he challenges the view that history went into decline during the period. His extensive bibliography of a hundred years of writings in and about the history of philosophy will take the reader beyond those that Hatfield considers in the essay itself. He then reviews various ways in which historical studies have been and might be used.

For Hatfield "truly historical" studies are those that contextualize the works they study. Because he thinks that problems endure over time, he rejects narrow historicism. And he finds no need to avoid criticism of past views, as long as we understand them as located in their own times. Good historical studies help us to understand landmark works better, and bring out assumptions we unconsciously make. Hatfield considers two other uses of history, of which he is more critical. Past works attract "fixer-uppers," like Strawson reworking Kant, and diagnosticians of current problems, like Rorty criticizing historical theories of perception. But Strawson does not care about the complete system of which he is retrofitting parts, and Rorty doesn't get his history right. Hatfield advocates "understanding past philosophy on its own terms" (103), while allowing that we cannot get free of present concerns.

Contextualized historians can focus on problems of the past, or on larger-scale projects; look at narrower or wider contexts; write history forward, as most do, or backward, as Michael Friedman does; trace themes across lengthy periods; study the reception of texts; and cross the boundaries of what we think of as periods. Contexts have usefully been expanded to include past science, religion, and theology. More work might be done on thematic history, on the overall "shape" of history, and on the reception of the texts we now study. We too readily accept old views of periods -- for instance that there was a skeptical period in early modern philosophy -- and Hatfield suggests giving more attention to the issue. He ends with illustrations of his claim that history improves our grasp of past texts and helps us uncover our hidden presuppositions.

Historians of philosophy are sometimes criticized for making their study relevant to current issues at the cost of being anachronistic, of reading the past through today's conceptual spectacles. If they avoid this, they may be criticized for being mere antiquarians, loving study of the past for its own sake (that is, for being historians). Sorrell worries this point briefly in his "Introduction". But Daniel Garber, who insists on contextualizing past writings to avoid anachronism, passionately embraces antiquarianism. And he argues that it is from antiquarian history that problem-solving analytic philosophers have the most to learn. Not because the past is a source of arguments and positions that may be helpful in current debates -- though it is that -- but for a more important reason.

Analytic philosophy, Garber holds, has moved from its initial heady insistence on solving problems by logical analysis to its current watery demand for precision and rigor. It is currently in a state of crisis. Its practitioners are doing Kuhnian normal philosophy but the paradigm itself is coming unraveled. What properly and fully contextualized study of the past can do is to show us the many different things philosophers were doing in working on the problems we take as central. Descartes was undermining Aristotelian philosophy, and with it the established university curriculum, and with it the universities and their role in supporting the church, and with this threatening a major source of social stability. We need not confine context to the corpus of a favored author's works or to the predecessors we know the philosopher considered. We can make it as broad as we choose. History gives us fresh views of what philosophy has done and so can do -- of what it was and so can be. And this is what is needed by problem-solvers today.

So far we have been urged to see history of philosophy as showing us arguments, distinctions, and theories we may use today, as aiding us in becoming more fully aware of our unconscious presuppositions, as useful for teaching beginners, as making us more fully reflective about our own activities than we have been, as showing us how to avoid past conceptual muddles while using the data of science, and as giving us visions different from those current of what philosophy is and does. Contextualized history seems to be the favorite; Hatfield and Garber seem to me to give the best statements of the case for its importance. Everyone agrees, moreover, that the benefit of the study of history for analytic philosophers is instrumental: they should study history because they'd find it a useful tool.

Yves Charles Zarka, the sole non-Anglophone contributor, suggests a different view. Using terminology that will be unfamiliar to Anglophone readers, he urges us not to sink philosophical texts in their contexts. What philosophers said goes beyond the times in which they said it. To deny this is to deny the special status of philosophy as searching for truth. Can we acknowledge this while still seeking historical understanding of a work in its own times? If we cut philosophy off from its past, we turn it into science and deny its special nature. The solution is to do history of philosophy as a way of doing philosophy itself.

Zarka is not as perspicuous as we might wish, but he is, I think, trying to say something none of the other essayists say. The suggestion is that we view the history of philosophy as itself philosophical. Zarka is perhaps urging us to view history of philosophy as Hegel did, not as a tool or a means for problem solving, but as embodying philosophy itself. We should take the study of history as itself the search for philosophical truth. Presumably this means more than that historians who work this way try to spell out and perhaps assess the arguments their subjects present. Even Anglophone historians do that, as Sorrell, Kenny and others here point out. But Zarka gives no example of what he has in mind, and his remarks, though tantalizing, are too abstract to give us any guidance.

If you are interested in hearing why problem-solving analytic philosophers should pay attention to work in the history of philosophy, the present volume will give you a thoughtful and fairly comprehensive review of reasons currently on offer. There are, however, gaps in the volume's coverage. Little is said, for instance, about the way historians of philosophy use the work of analytic philosophers, and how this can result in reassessment of the past. This is a topic that might have come up had any effort been made to relate the history of ancient philosophy to analytic work. Students of classical philosophy have been bringing analytic insights and tools to their texts for a long time now, and with great success.

Another gap is due to the fact that the writers here all concentrate on history of metaphysics and epistemology, though Sorrell and Wilson pay some attention to ethics. In this the essayists follow current practice in teaching the history of philosophy. Just about every college and university offers a course on the history of philosophy from Descartes to Kant, in which the focus is on metaphysics and epistemology. But in the USA at least only a tiny percentage offer any course on the history of moral philosophy (even fewer teach the history of logic or of aesthetics). No doubt analytic philosophers include history of ethics in their general deprecation of historical study. But had the volume paid more attention to that area, it might have included consideration of an illuminating counterpart debate -- the extensive discussion generated by Quentin Skinner's strong claim that the history of political philosophy has no lessons for contemporary thought. Wilson presents the view briefly but does not discuss it in detail. But Skinner has given more philosophical attention to the reasons for insisting on contextualizing old texts than historians of metaphysics and epistemology have generally done. Given the contextualist bent of the volume's authors, comparison with Skinner's work would have been instructive.

Consideration of teaching philosophy raises another point. Though Sorrell and Wilson discuss teaching briefly, they do not ask why history of modern philosophy should in fact be one of the main paths into philosophy for college students -- either through the texts used in "classics of philosophy" courses, or through the history surveys. If most philosophy faculty are indifferent or hostile to history, and if, as Wilson says, we have no evidence showing that history courses provide the best introduction to philosophy, the answer is not obvious. To a large extent faculty are responding to student demand. But that only pushes the question back: why the strong student interest in history? Wilson worries about the cost of hiring historical specialists; but her problem-solving colleagues seem to think them necessary. Why? Perhaps it is because new PhD's who know some history have a better shot at jobs than those who are ignorant of it.

We hear much about what analytic philosophers miss if they ignore history, but nothing of damage to historical work from being oriented to problem-solvers' uses of it. No one here asks why, and even whether, historians of philosophy should care about the response of problem-solvers to their work. Is it only because the problem-solvers largely control hiring, promotions, and raises?