Analytic Theology: New Essays in the Philosophy of Theology

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Oliver D. Crisp and Michael C. Rea (eds.), Analytic Theology: New Essays in the Philosophy of Theology, Oxford UP, 2009, 316pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199203567.

Reviewed by Gordon Graham, Princeton Theological Seminary



The editors of this volume have elicited new essays from an impressive list of contributors, including both long established figures in philosophy and theology and others relatively new. Since all the essays make interesting contributions to topics of importance, they all merit comment. At the same time, since the essays were commissioned and collected in this volume for a specific purpose — namely to explain, elaborate and explore the merits of ‘analytic theology’ — a review adequate to the aims of the editors must resist the temptation to be distracted by the arguments of individual authors, and must address the more general issue of how well, and even whether, the essays contribute to this overall purpose.

The collection is divided into four parts, and in his introduction Michael Rea explains this organization. The three essays in the first part set out analytic theology’s credentials. Those in Part II set these credentials in historical context. Part III brings the conception to bear on some prominent theological topics — the divine inspiration of Scripture, religious experience, science and religion. In Part IV, the editors have courageously given a platform to critics of analytic theology’s ambitions, critics, moreover, of considerable academic weight — Eleonore Stump, Merold Westphal and Sarah Coakley.

What is analytic theology? Rea offers us a succinct characterization:

analytic theology is just the activity of approaching theological topics with the ambitions of an analytic philosopher and in a style that conforms to the prescriptions that are distinctive of analytic philosophical discourse. (p. 7)

This brief statement, of course, only becomes fully informative if we are told what the ‘ambitions’ and ‘style’ distinctive of analytic philosophy are. Rea has things to say about this. Indeed he sets out two ambitions and five points of style. Even before we consider this further explanation, however, perplexities arise that, in my judgment, the ensuing essays intensify rather than dispel. They do so not because of disagreements between the authors, but because of their uncertainty as to how this new terminology is to be used, and what its significance is exactly.

Here is one example. In his essay “How Philosophical Theology Became Possible”, Nicholas Wolterstorff seeks to explain the remarkable change in status that philosophy of religion underwent in the 20th century. Having had virtually no place in the intellectual world of logical positivism, fifty years later it had become one of the most vibrant areas of Anglo-American philosophy. Part of the explanation (in my view) must lie with the influential work of a few highly gifted philosophers who took religion seriously (including Wolterstorff himself, of course). Wolterstorff’s own explanation, however, lends special weight to the collapse of ‘classical foundationalism’ in epistemology. Once the long held belief in a single epistemological litmus test was abandoned, the way opened up for philosophers trained in the style and methods of logical empiricism and conceptual analysis to take religious beliefs as properly basic, and explore the implications and possibilities of doing so. For my own part I find this explanation very convincing, but how does the possibility of philosophical theology relate to the project of analytic theology? In the concluding paragraphs Wolterstorff addresses this issue briefly. Having noted that contemporary philosophical theology is now no less concerned with traditional questions in the doctrine of God than it is with the arguments of natural theology, Wolterstorff says “Is it philosophy or is it theology? What difference does it make. . ? Call it what you will” (p. 168). But it does make a very great difference from the point of this volume. If philosophical theology of the kind that the collapse of foundationalism made possible is indistinguishable from analytic theology, then the theme of the essays in Part I is empty, because analytic theology is nothing new, and has been carried on with vigor for the last four decades or more.

It is not enough to reply that Wolterstorff is being a little idiosyncratic here. There is genuine uncertainty. In another interesting essay, Andrew Chignell gives a careful account of Kant’s strictures on thinking about God and shows persuasively that, contrary to a supposition that has been widespread in contemporary theology, “we can engage in substantive analytic theology, even by Kantian lights” (p. 135). It will come as good news to (some) theologians that philosophical theology after Kant is not as problematic as has generally been thought, but despite Chignell’s use of the term ‘analytic theology’, this tells us very little about the possibilities for a new theological enterprise. Indeed, in a footnote Chignell more or less admits this when he says “I frankly have some trouble seeing a significant difference between analytic theology and what has recently been called ‘philosophical theology’ in the analytic tradition” (p. 119).

Might the difference emerge negatively? Might we get a better handle on just what analytic theology is through the characterizations of its critics? The three essays in Part IV are all well worth reading, but they do little to illuminate this issue. All three make the focus of their reflections the analytical tradition in philosophy as a whole, and none of them show that the deficiencies they identify in this tradition are specially related to the extension of its methods to theology, or that the ways in which these deficiencies might be mitigated owe anything special to theology. Eleonore Stump, who has an even broader target in view — “philosophy as it is widely practiced in the Anglo-American tradition” (p. 252) — thinks that it is recent work in neurobiology that reveals the inevitable narrowness of this tradition and that the cure lies in an engagement with literature and literary criticism that accords them equal status as modes of knowledge. Merold Westphal focuses on the distinction between ‘analytic’ and ‘continental’ philosophy. He doubts if such a distinction is absolute, and eschews any ambition to demonstrate the superiority of the latter. Rather he wants to show “how discourse to and about God can be understood in the light of two overlapping continental traditions, phenomenology and hermeneutics” and leaves it to the reader to draw comparisons with theology of a more analytical kind. Sarah Coakley’s topic (and target) is very precise — the use of Teresa of Avila as an example in philosophical arguments about religious experience. She thinks it an error to regard mystical experience such as Teresa’s as episodic rather than integral to developed and sustained spiritual practices. I am sure this is correct, and worth saying, but the mistaken nature of one approach to a single topic hardly counts as a counter to a proposed new method of theological inquiry in general.

The essays in Part III might be thought to provide some clarification of these uncertainties in a different way — by showing the method of analytical theology at work on specific issues. It is not obvious that this is how they are intended, but if they are, it is hard to see that they work. Thomas McCall does aim to employ the theory of speech acts as elaborated by Austin and Searle to resolve what he sees as tensions within Karl Barth’s account of the Bible as the Word of God. This discussion, however, seems somewhat tangential to me, and the main concern of his essay is the interpretation of Barth, not the direct exploration of a major theological topic. Thomas Crisp employs the kind of probabilistic reasoning that Richard Swinburne made familiar in the philosophy of religion, but it does not have much (or perhaps any) bearing on the theology of Scripture. Michael Sudduth, who discusses the role of religious experience in natural and dogmatic theology, and Michael Murray have written thoughtful pieces. Nevertheless, either, and especially Murray’s, could have been included in collections that had no special interest in or relevance to the methods of ‘analytical’ theology.

So the question remains: just what is new about ‘analytic theology’ and how does it differ from the kind of philosophical theology made familiar over the last few decades by Plantinga, Swinburne, Wolterstorff and the generation of philosophers that they inspired? Since the three essays in Part I are meant to set out its nature and credentials, it might seem obvious that this is where a review of the book focused on this question should have started. Yet as I read them the same uncertainties are to be found even here. The essay by Rea’s co-editor Oliver Crisp is entitled “On Analytic Theology” and is the essay most plainly pertinent to the question. It has the slightly defensive tone of someone more concerned to deflect criticism than expound a vision. This is understandable, I am sure, since contemporary theology is more likely to be hostile than hospitable to anything that plausibly falls under this label. More importantly, however, Crisp observes that philosophers currently engaged in ‘analytic philosophical theology’ tend to defend their approach by finding in it a continuity with the classical theologians of the past that contemporary theology has abandoned, a continuity John Lamont illustrates in his essay, “A Conception of Faith in the Greek Fathers”. Crisp quotes Alvin Plantinga on precisely this point, and comments that “there is more than a grain of truth in [the] assertion” that “the best work in philosophical theology in the English speaking world and over the past quarter century has not been done by the theologians but by philosophers” (p. 39). I agree, but if this is true, ‘analytic theology’ can only be a further refinement on the developments of the last forty years, and one that is left with relatively little to do that is new.

Randal Rauser’s highly readable and robust essay on “Theology as a Bull Session” makes an interesting case for analytic theology. Elaborating on the central thought of Harry Frankfurt’s (now) famous essay “On Bullshit”, Rauser argues that the emphasis on clarity typical of analytic philosophy will provide some protection against the tide of bullshit that is licensed (no doubt unintentionally) by theology in the style of Sally McFague and Jurgen Moltmann. I am readily persuaded by this contention, but it seems to me that the counters to bullshit — clarity of expression, rigor of argument and honesty of intellectual purpose — are merits in ALL intellectual inquiry and not the preserve of a distinctive theological method. Further, by quoting Maes and Schaubroek on this point Rauser effectively agrees, since their reference is to ‘academic discourse’ in general (p. 73).

William Abraham is more forthright and visionary. The title of his essay, “Systematic Theology as Analytic Theology”, gives a clear indication that he wants to go further than Crisp and Rauser and look to the methods of analytical philosophy to come to the rescue of the mishmash that is contemporary systematic theology. At the same time he insists that “the subject matter of systematic theology has its own integrity”, so analytic theology is a method for doing theology and not a replacement (p. 69). Interestingly, though, in order to argue for this point he relies on a conception of philosophy as an inquiry that delivers results that systematic theology may use. In this respect, Abraham’s picture of philosophy’s relation to theology is somewhat like a common picture of its relation to cognitive science. Common though it is, it is also highly questionable. Since philosophers rarely agree, there are never any settled ‘results’ in the way that there are in other disciplines. This is not just a matter of contrariness. It has to do with the nature of the subject because, as Wolterstoff rightly observes in his essay, “Philosophy as a whole is an ineradicably pluralist enterprise”.

This brings me to some final thoughts on the collection. Here and there, as in the essays by Abraham and Wolterstorff, there are passing reflections on the nature of philosophy in general as an intellectual activity, but not enough to explore its relation to theology adequately. Further, there are surprisingly few reflections on the enterprise of theology, and its relation to religion. One of the most interesting chapters from this point of view is Andrew Dole’s essay on “Schleiermacher’s Theological Anti-realism”. Dole interprets Schleiermacher as insisting that “to engage in metaphysics within theology … would be to contaminate religion by bringing an alien motivation — an interest in truth for its own sake — into the fold” (p. 151). He goes on to draw a somewhat limited implication from this:

the analytic theologian who acts from a serious interest in the truth-relevant content of religious doctrines without turning a blind eye to the other dimensions of religious discourse will … have learnt the lesson that Schleiermacher has to teach. (p. 153)

I think there is a better lesson to be learned. In his essay Oliver Crisp employs the ancient dictum of “faith seeking understanding”. This is not the same as faith seeking truth. Given its “ineradicable pluralism”, however, philosophy is not plausibly interpreted as seeking truth anyway. What it seeks is a distinctive kind of understanding, a profoundly intellectual one that can only be gained through an exercise of strictly intellectual virtues. What passes for philosophy does not always exemplify this, and sometimes in the analytic tradition it exhibits what Eleonore Stump refers to as “the vices of its virtues” (a danger to which Thomas Crisp might plausibly be accused of having succumbed in this volume). When it does exemplify these virtues, however, philosophy is in a special position. While eschewing any claims on behalf of human reason to establish truths about God, and discarding the metaphysical constructions that have tended to accompany such claims, it can nevertheless counter the retreat to ‘feeling’ so often attributed (wrongly) to Schleiermacher, and thus help believers to love God with ‘all their mind’. I doubt if much is to be accomplished by labelling this mode of religious life ‘analytic theology’. The fact remains, however, that for the most part these are good essays well worth reading, and if the editors’ principal purpose has not been realized, they are still to be congratulated on commissioning some very fine work.