Animalkind: What We Owe to Animals

Placeholder book cover

Jean Kazez, Animalkind: What We Owe to Animals, Wiley-Blackwell, 2010, 206pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405199384.

Reviewed by Gary Varner, Texas A&M University


This book offers an overview of basic questions in animal ethics, both theoretical and applied. Written to engage non-philosophers, the method is Socratic: Kazez asks a range of thought-provoking questions that goad the reader into appreciating how complex the issues are. While offering little new to philosophers studying animal ethics, the book is excellent reading for those with no prior exposure to the relevant philosophical literature and could be used for a portion of an introductory level course in contemporary moral issues.

The title plays on how recognizing others as members of our own kind calls forth the moral response of kindness:

"Kindness" and "kinds" share a common origin, the English cynd, also the root of "kin." To be kind, if we take etymology as our guide, is to treat someone as kin, as "my kind." An enlightened extension of the idea is that not just family members matter, but all members of my kind -- my tribe, my nation, or even my species. And an even more enlightened idea allows that members of other species could be my kind at least to some degree, and in a morally relevant sense. (pp. 30-31)

The flip side is that differences can matter too, and this leads Kazez to look hard at what animals -- including humans -- are really like. The results are not clear-cut, because the picture that emerges is complicated and multi-faceted.

She begins by describing how religions and indigenous myths have misconstrued or distorted what the differences are and how humans and animals are related. This includes various indigenous cultures' beliefs about hunting: that animals voluntarily give their lives to respectful hunters, or that they don't "really" die and that ensures an unending supply of meat. Such myths are readily dismissed today, but Kazez thinks that a similar idea about domestication -- that animals "chose" it -- is "no more plausible" (p. 16). Both ideas, she suggests, are salves for consciences uneasy about humans' relationships with animals. Ancient and modern civilizations have all realized that "Killing an animal is not like pulling a carrot out of the ground" (p. 18).

In succeeding chapters, she examines how thinking, self-awareness, freedom, and morality are all multi-faceted and each comes in degrees. Still, she denies that there is a good analogy between species bias and racial or sexual bias:

We have been thinking about issues of race and gender long enough that we have at least a rough notion -- though controversial around the edges -- what it's like to be bias free. If we are without prejudice, we will not see vast differences separating men and women, blacks and whites.

But if we are without prejudice against animals, surely we will still see vast differences. Species differences are much greater than race and gender differences. Granted, they are exaggerated by a tradition that puts animals on the other side of some profound divide -- casting them as devoid of consciousness, or reason, or emotion, or anything resembling morality. Still, even if the differences are not so stark, they are real. There is far more reason in people than in crows, even if crows are impressive. Morality is much more highly developed in people than in dogs. If we declared males or whites superior in these ways, we'd be sexists or racists. But if we notice deep differences between different species, we are simply being realistic. (p. 81)

She then endorses a version of the view that "An individual's life has more value the more that it is full of desire-satisfaction" (p. 83). Since having the suite of cognitive capacities listed above "results in a profusion of desires," this justifies the general conclusion that humans' lives have special value; "consonant with a very deep-rooted belief that we are not our circumstances," however, it makes sense to value a life on the basis of its "potential, not the way it's actually going to play out" (p. 85).

Kazez then analyzes various human uses of animals in terms of two factors: (1) showing "due respect" for lives based on their potential for a rich tapestry of desires, and (2) how clearly our uses of animals promote "serious and compelling" goals rather than "mere desires" (p. 106). Humans are justified in killing animals for food, if that is the only way to survive, because the respect due to a normal human is greater than that due any animal, and under the circumstances killing animals is the only way to promote the serious goal of human flourishing.

There's no question that it's disrespectful to end an animal's life, then dismember her and turn her into stew… . But using isn't the only way of disrespecting. Standing by idly while someone fades away, or letting yourself fade away, can involve disrespect as well. (p. 103)

So while Paleolithic hunters treated the animals they hunted disrespectfully, it would have been a greater act of disrespect to leave their families malnourished or starved.

When it comes to modern humans living in affluent, industrialized societies it is less clear that serious goals are served by meat-heavy diets. The same goes for leather clothing and various uses of animals for entertainment, decorations, and so on. Kazez thinks, however, that some medical research clearly serves a serious goal and saves human lives. Her paradigm example is Jonas Salk's development of the polio vaccine; about 100,000 monkeys died, but there were 57,000 reported cases of polio in 1952 alone. Harry Harlow's work also had the serious goal of better understanding the effects of maternal deprivation: "it's critical for case workers to know that a child's clinging to his mother is not evidence that abuse has not occurred. Parents need to know that children want physical comfort even more than they need food" (p. 143). But Kazez finds it implausible to say that Harlow's research was an important contribution when other approaches were leading in the same direction.

The so-called problem of marginal cases arises for any view which, like Kazez's, holds that certain cognitive capacities give special value to human lives. The "marginals" are human beings who lack the normal suite of human cognitive capacities. The problem is how to justify treating these humans differently than animals with similar cognitive capacities. Kazez claims that her view's focus on kinds addresses this concern:

When people are impaired -- less capable than before, or than they "should" have been -- we don't simply think of them sui generis, simply as the kind of thing they've come to be … . It makes sense to be extra distressed by the combination of the original misfortune and the prospect of a person being left behind.

Obviously certain cognitive impairments are going to alter what respectful treatment of them requires, but this at least gives some reason for choosing to use animals in medical research rather than "marginal" humans. Our "extra sympathy" for marginal humans also stems from the sense of our own vulnerability that their situation excites (p. 96).

Kazez closes by emphasizing that "Respect is not a perfectly crisp concept," so "for the foreseeable future, there's bound to be some dispute over what a respectful person may and may not do" (p. 174). Kazez eats no red meat but eats fish occasionally, she buys eggs from cage-free or free-range sources, and she generally avoids leather products.

I tell my tale knowing that from the perspective of a scrupulous vegan, I'm not doing that well. The story is really meant for the reader who has given up nothing and can't imagine making the leap from total dependence on animal products to total abstinence. If the really important thing is the benefit to animals, do not scoff at reducing consumption as a positive step. The point is not to be perfect but to prevent (as much as you can) harm to animals. (pp. 179-80)

Kazez is optimistic, however, that a combination of technological advances (e.g. in vitro meat) and alliances with other concerns (about health and environmental impacts) will continue to drive improvements in animal welfare throughout society.

Readers familiar with the philosophical literature on animal ethics will find little that is new in this book, but that is not its goal -- it is designed to provide an engaging and fair-minded overview of the area. Kazez does, however, offer a novel and insightful objection to what Tom Regan says about survival hunting.

In The Case for Animal Rights (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1983, p. 351) Regan imagines that four humans and a dog are adrift in a lifeboat and that if the others do not eat one of the five, none will survive. Regan claims that under these circumstances his worse-off principle implies that the humans should eat the dog. Regan's worse-off principle holds that where non-comparable harms are involved, respectful treatment entails choosing the option under which you avoid harming that individual (or individuals) who would be harmed significantly more than any would be harmed under the alternative option(s). According to Regan, death harms a human being significantly more than it harms any non-human animal, so in the lifeboat case the worse-off principle requires us to avoid harming the humans, which means eating the dog. Regan cautions that what his rights view implies in these "exceptional circumstances" cannot be generalized to contemporary animal agriculture, because we have options other than eating meat; but Kazez argues that even when humans have no other option, it's not really a lifeboat case, for the same reason that Regan denies that medical research constitutes a lifeboat case.

Regarding medical research, Regan acknowledges that his worse-off principle would seem to imply that humans can justifiably kill animals to save themselves from a disease that threatens them (because death would harm them significantly more than it would harm any research animals). He holds, however, that "Risks are not morally transferable to those who do not voluntarily choose to take them," and this means that it is wrong to infect animals who aren't at risk from a disease themselves in order to reduce the risk that disease poses to humans. Regan holds that this "special consideration" blocks the application of his worse-off principle to the case of medical research (Case for Animal Rights, pp. 322 & 377). Another way to put the same point, however, is that this means that the medical research case isn't a true lifeboat case, because in a true lifeboat case, all the parties are in the same risky situation.

Kazez notes that the animals killed by Paleolithic hunters were not normally "in the same boat," because the hunted animals didn't need to eat meat to survive -- they were generally herbivores with plenty of forage available. So, she says: "Regan would have to say the same thing about Mr. Caveman. It's his problem that he's starving and he has no right to make it the aurochs' problem" (p. 192).

This is a novel insight about what Regan's rights view should say about survival hunting. To my knowledge, no one else has noticed how his reasons for opposing medical research would also count against survival hunting.