Anne Conway: A Woman Philosopher

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Sarah Hutton, Anne Conway: A Woman Philosopher, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 280pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 052183547x.

Reviewed by Karen Detlefsen, University of Pennsylvania


Anne Conway (1631-1679) wrote one complete philosophical treatise and corresponded with several contemporary philosophers and other thinkers. The treatise, The Principles of the Most Modern and Ancient Philosophy (hereafter Principles) was published posthumously, in 1690. The letters were collected and published in 1930 by Marjorie Nicholson, with an updated version published by Nicholson and Sarah Hutton in 1992. The Principles is, according to Hutton, "constructed on an a priori model" (127), and Conway's mode of argument is "by logical deduction" (214), thus suggesting its suitability to analytic, logical treatment. The reader of Hutton's book on Conway, however, will not find such a treatment, for the Principles do not serve as the spine of Hutton's book; rather, Conway's life and intellectual development serve as that spine. There is some helpful skeletal information on Conway's philosophy provided in the opening pages (2-9 passim), and a more thorough summary of the arguments of the Principles outlined in the final chapter (220-5) concerning Conway's legacy. These sections of the book aside, the crucial elements of Conway's philosophy emerge slowly as the chapters of her life unfold, perhaps in much the same fashion that her philosophy developed in Conway's own mind. Hutton has done a superb job at reconstructing that life and providing exhaustive contextual background to Conway's intellectual development. This is an immensely learned book which will appeal to the historian of culture and ideas of the seventeenth century, to one already familiar with the arguments of Conway's text and wanting more context to that terse and complex book, or to one interested in gaining an understanding of the context in a lead-up to an intensive study of the Principles.

It would be impossible to recount the many and myriad influences that Hutton documents as having helped shape Conway's mature philosophy. I shall consider just three that seem to have been of primary importance: her acquaintance with Henry More, her health difficulties and searches for a cure, and her engagement with various religions.

Conway's brother, John Finch, "brought her into contact with Henry More, the man from whom she received her philosophical training, and who remained her life-long mentor" (38). Their correspondence establishes that she received training in Cartesian philosophy during these sessions (43), though More always encouraged her to approach Descartes in a non-dogmatic, critical fashion (48), an attitude she clearly adopted in her philosophy given that her Principles departs notably from both Descartes' and More's philosophy (49). More himself was opposed to Descartes' form of dualism, in part because of its perceived inability to account for the interaction of minds and bodies, and More replaced this with a distinctive kind of dualism, according to which spirit and body are both extended, but spirit is penetrable and indiscerpible while body is impenetrable and discerpible. Their shared extension is meant to overcome the problem of interaction. Additionally, in order to account for motion in the material world given that matter is inactive, More proposes that "[m]otion is brought about not by matter colliding with matter, but by spirit infusing the matter" (83), and doing so by a "'vital congruity', according to which both soul and body are predisposed to receive one another" (83). More also proposed the existence of a "Hylarchic Principle" or the "Spirit of Nature", "which is … reminiscent of the Platonic World Soul" (84) and is called upon to explain the phenomena of the world that cannot be explained in terms of mechanism. There is some shared territory between More and Conway. Both are working within a broadly Platonic framework. Moreover, "both More and Conway posit an intermediary cause between God and the world: in many ways Conway's natura media corresponds to More's Spirit of Nature … . Conway, like More, conceived of all created substance as extended" (87). Conway's "Middle Nature" -- sometimes called Christ, sometimes Adam Kadmon reflecting her interest in the Kabbalah -- is one of three species she claims exist. The other two are God and all of creation. Christ is the mediator between God and creation, acting as the instrument of God who is unchanging and cannot act directly in our world characterized by change. The third and lowest species -- creation -- is essentially one sort of thing, and on this point she dissents from More by rejecting his dualism of two essentially different kinds of created substances. Rather, according to Conway, matter and spirit (both extended) lie on a continuum (88-9), with body being less penetrable than spirit, and both being discerpible. Faced with the same difficulties with Cartesianism that More confronts, Conway takes More's approach to its logical conclusion (89), positing a spiritual monism as opposed to the material monism of, for example, her brother, Hobbes and Margaret Cavendish (chpt. 5). I return to Conway's supposed spiritual monism below.

The second significant element in Conway's life was her ill health. "From her teens, Anne Conway suffered from bouts of inexplicable pain, the main symptom of which was an unrelievable headache. These 'fits' grew more intense, more frequent and more prolonged as she grew older. This medical condition was a major shaping factor in her life" (30). Seeking relief from the pain, Conway met or read the works of some of the most influential medical men of her time, including Thomas Willis (119ff), Robert Boyle (123ff) Valentine Greatrakes (128ff), and Henry Stubbe (130f). And "it was through events supervening upon her consultation of the Irish healer, Valentine Greatrakes, that she became a front-row spectator of the debates about method and interpretation occasioned by the experimentalism of Robert Boyle (1627-91) and his defenders in the Royal Society" (116). So her ill health led to her awareness of some of the central issues in natural philosophy in seventeenth-century England.

Conway's desire to find relief from her headaches also brought her in touch with Francis Mercury van Helmont, probably second only to More in terms of his importance to her intellectual development. "Of all the medical practitioners with whom Anne Conway was acquainted, Francis Mercury van Helmont had by far the most far-reaching impact on her life" (145). His "crucial importance" extended beyond his role as therapeutic practitioner, for he introduced Conway to Quakerism and Kabbalism (140). He brought Conway into contact with Christian Knorr von Rosenroth who was translating works from the Zohar. Although his Kabbala denudata did not appear until 1677-8, Conway had access to manuscripts as early as 1671, thereby taking an early interest in Jewish Kabbalism (161), an interest rare among English gentiles (156). The Kabbalistic influence on her philosophy is obvious from a reading of the Principles. Quakerism, too, was crucial in Conway's life; she converted (much to the horror of her brothers [186]) in 1677 or 1678 (177). (While van Helmont provided one connection between Conway and Quakerism, by far the most important individual in Conway's life on this front was George Keith [184ff].) The link between Quakerism and Conway's physical suffering was direct and obvious. "To Lady Conway, the Quakers were, like Christ himself, a living model of suffering, fortitude, humiliation and patience. For their part, Quakers regarded her as an example of Christian patience and forbearing to be emulated by all" (180). Indeed, the suffering Conway underwent as a result of her health colors her philosophy as is evident in both her substance monism, and in her (yet to be discussed) theodicy: "Throughout her correspondence, the most frequent occasion for expressions of religious convictions is Anne Conway's ill health … . Just as Anne Conway sought, in her philosophy, to account for the fact that the mind suffers when the body is in pain [a direct consequence of their being the same thing -- her monism], so also she had to explain how a good and loving God could allow His creatures to suffer [her theodicy]" (62). In short, then, her physical pain both resulted in her acquaintance with many natural philosophers who exercised significant influences upon her, and dovetails with key elements of her philosophy.

The third crucial influence upon Conway's philosophy, already broached above, is her religious life. Kabbalism and Quakerism came late, but they both reflect the ecumenical and tolerant attitude that she had always taken to religion (58, 104). Early in her life, she believed Christianity and philosophy to be incompatible, but she quickly turned her efforts to determining how the two could be reconciled (53). According to Hutton, while many in Conway's circle (e.g. van Helmont, Keith) took religion as primary, Conway took philosophy as primary (214), with her religious beliefs acting as a sort of pervasive background. Perhaps one example showing this primacy of the philosophical to the religious is her theodicy. Recall that she posits three species: God, Christ, and creation. God is defined traditionally, but she also includes "spirit, light, and life" as among his essential attributes. Indeed, these are the first she mentions.[1] God, because eternal and unchanging, creates by emanation, and so creation and all of its creatures have existed and will exist eternally.[2] These bare facts of her metaphysics allow her to deny hell and to affirm universal salvation. How so? She accomplishes this through her philosophy of substance. Every individual contains something of the God from which it emanates, and so every individual has some "spirit, light, and life". Every individual is active, and contains goodness. Nonetheless, because creatures are essentially mutable, we can change for the worse, and we do so when we act badly. This moral action is free, and it has an ontological dimension, for bad actions result in the transformation of an individual into one closer to the bodily end of the continuum of substance. Bad moral actions result in that individual falling to a lesser, more material, denser state. But likewise, so too can an individual redeem itself by doing good actions, and Conway uses the example of a horse transforming into a human after the death of the horse body to reflect that individual's moral improvement.[3] While we might fall further down the chain of perfection, we have the chance to improve ourselves infinitely (without ever, thereby, reaching the state of God from whom we are separated by our essentially different natures), and the belief that such self-improvement can eventually happen for all creatures underwrites her faith in universal salvation. And so, "the justice of God gloriously appears in the transformation of things …".[4] Conway thus uses her philosophy (her conception of God, of creation, of the intimate relation between mind and body) to develop a theodicy, and her religious commitments here are accommodated to her more primary philosophical beliefs, and the metaphysical system she tries to construct.

From these influences and many more besides, Hutton details the emergence and character of Conway's philosophy. We can also see the source of Hutton's belief that Conway's is a spiritual as opposed to material monism. "Anne Conway argued that, if God is 'life itself', his entire creation must be a living reflection of the vitality of the creator. Her account of created nature in chapters VI and VII [of the Principles] is closer to vitalistic theories of her time than to the mechanical philosophy of Descartes, and the modified version of it proposed by More … . She insists on the spirituality of 'every motion and action' and describes the interaction of bodies and particles in terms of 'emanation'" (141). "[T]he basic 'stuff' of all created things is constituted from a single substance possessing the properties of spirit (principally life and action)" (211). Precisely because the created world is an emanation of God -- and so is living and active -- it is essentially spiritual. But Hutton's characterization of Conway on this point raises questions. An obvious comparison is between Conway and Cavendish. Both are monists in the sense that both believe there is one kind of stuff in the created world. Both believe that this one kind of stuff is essentially active, living, and perceptive, and both believe it to be extended. But Cavendish is usually thought of as a materialist, precisely because she denies the possibility of immaterial substance in the created world, as Hutton points out (113). In what way, then, is Conway so different as to be dubbed a spiritual monist while Cavendish is a material monist? The question is especially acute when we emphasize the fact that Conway's one substance is extended, a hallmark (for some) of matter. It seems more accurate to say that 'spirit' and 'matter' lose traditional meaning altogether for Conway, and the one kind of substance she acknowledges includes characteristics of both, in the end being neither matter nor spirit.

It is crucial to come to terms with this issue if we are to properly understand the relation between Conway's thought and that of Leibniz, which Hutton approaches in her consideration of Conway's legacy. Hutton takes a balanced view of this issue, noting both points of overlap as well as some differences between the thinkers (233-5). Outlining their common ground, she writes: "Both can be characterized as idealists in so far as they both regarded the substantial constituents of nature as immaterial spirit (historically speaking, Platonism would be a better designation) … . Anne Conway like Leibniz was a vitalist, and, like him, she elaborated her vitalism as a monadology. Each postulates monads as simple entities expressive of the unity and infinity of God through the simplicity of the individual monad and the infinite multiplicity of the monads in their ontological class" (234). This invites closer investigation. Here is what Conway says about monads: "The division of things is never in terms of the smallest mathematical term but the smallest physical term. And when concrete matter is so divided that it disperses into physical monads, such as it was in the first state of its formation, then it is ready to resume its activity and become spirit …".[5] Conway's monads are physical, not immaterial. (Note, though, that she still considered them spiritual.) Leibniz's monads are not physical but immaterial because unextended, something that cannot be said of Conway's monads (as the quote from her Principles just cited attests). While the extended world is, for Leibniz, a phenomenon, it is, for Conway, real because substance itself is extended. At the most foundational level of their ontologies, Conway and Leibniz diverge, for they have markedly different conceptions of the nature of the world's substance. One obvious consequence of this is their radically divergent theodicies. Conway's theodicy is based in part in the non-determinism of individual creatures, while Leibniz is forced to grapple with the thoroughgoing determinism of created individuals. It is no wonder that Leibniz's claims to the closeness of his and Conway's philosophy (233-4) are all abstract, for he surely would have seen the deep disagreements had he looked at the specifics of Conway's system.

In addition to the impeccable historical reconstruction and some explication of Conway's philosophy, Hutton raises some pressing questions in historiography of philosophy. One of these is the issue of the relation between Conway and feminist interests of the twentieth and twenty-first centuries. She deals both with claims to the 'female' conception of nature that thinkers such as Conway supposedly held (239), and with contemporary anti-Cartesian attempts to develop a feminist epistemology (240). Hutton rightly shows the limits, and even the anachronism, of this approach by turning to the attitude of seventeenth-century women themselves. "Contrary to the perceptions of feminist anti-Cartesians, the lesson of history is that Cartesianism offered opportunities for women to philosophise that the Aristotelianism it replaced did not. We need to be mindful that the interpretative strategies of feminist anti-Cartesians have been honed to tackle issues besetting modernity and post-modernity" (242).

A second issue in historiography raised by Hutton's book is that of canon-formation. "It is, however, easy to forget that canon formation -- that is, what determines the selection of particular aspects of philosophy as important -- is itself historically contingent, and that the philosophical canon is not fixed for all time … .The unknowns are, almost by definition, the philosophers for whom there is no interpretive tradition" (237). This point is perhaps what motivates Hutton's overall approach, which she describes as follows:

In respect of methodology, my study perhaps has more in common with recent work in the history of science than with the history of philosophy as currently practised in the Anglophone world.

It is most certainly not my aim to reconstruct what Anne Conway might have said on modern issues, or to subject her arguments to analytic critique. My focus will be on the nature of her philosophy rather than the 'strength' or 'validity' of her arguments … . [The historical approach] is born of the recognition that, in order to familiarise ourselves with the forgotten names of philosophical history, we must return to origins and study their works within the philosophical conditions of their production … . We have, in other words, to reconstruct [the] context. Although historical in method, my aim here is ultimately philosophical: to enhance our understanding of Anne Conway's philosophy and to give her a meaningful philosophical identity (12-3).

This recalls the oft-debated distinction between the history of ideas and the history of philosophy. There are (at least) two separate issues that need to be distinguished when discussing our approach to past philosophers. The first is the issue of anachronism, or interpreting past figures from within our current, and completely foreign, framework in order to deal with problems that are relevant to us but not to past philosophers. This is, indeed, to be avoided, and the threat of anachronism is all the greater in the case of "unknown" figures precisely because they have not helped to shape our current philosophical sensibilities and so seem all the more foreign to us and thus prone to misinterpretation. The second issue in this historiographical debate is the issue of engaging in analysis of past philosophical texts. This seems a perfectly legitimate philosophical activity, even to one with a passion for understanding the historical context of the philosophy being analyzed, as long as the analysis takes place from within the historical framework of the thinker under investigation. After all, Conway herself engaged in active analysis of the strength and validity of her contemporaries' philosophical views (e.g. 48, 49), and we as historians and philosophers are perfectly able to understand this philosophical analysis and judge it by its merits. Our analysis of past philosophers' works will be made all the more easy, accurate, and meaningful with as full an historical context as possible. Hutton's superb work in this domain with respect to Anne Conway will permit precisely such careful and even-handed analysis of Conway's extraordinary philosophical work, and it is thus an important contribution to the ongoing project of recovering past, forgotten philosophers in order to reconstruct a richer, more equitable history of the discipline.

[1] Anne Conway, Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy. Edited by Allison P. Coudert and Taylor Corse. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996, p. 9.

[2] Ibid. pp. 12ff.

[3] Ibid. pp. 32-3. This may be seen as a sort of reincarnation.

[4] Ibid. p. 28.

[5] Ibid. p. 20, emphasis added.