Anselm of Canterbury and the Desire for the Word

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Eileen C. Sweeney, Anselm of Canterbury and the Desire for the Word, Catholic University of America Press, 2012, 403pp., $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813219585.

Reviewed by Katherin A. Rogers, University of Delaware


There are many approaches to, and purposes for, studying a long-dead philosopher like Anselm of Canterbury. Some who write on Anselm do so in hopes of advancing present debates that are of perennial interest. Among these philosophers, whom we might describe as philosophizing with Anselm, some merely glance at Anselm's work as an inspiration to go their own way, while others take the historical Anselm more seriously and try to grasp his arguments and evaluate them critically for validity and even for soundness. Sweeney is not trying to philosophize with Anselm, and the reader looking for analytic assessments of Anselm's various arguments will not find them in her book. For example, Sweeney discusses the famous Proslogion argument for the existence of God, but she does not ask whether or not it might be persuasive, nor does she even spell out what she takes the argument to be (148-165). She discusses Anselm's attempted solution to the freedom/foreknowledge dilemma from De Concordia, but does not explain what the dilemma is or how Anselm attempts to solve it (346-353).

The book is not about the structure, the validity, or the soundness of Anselm's individual philosophical arguments. It is rather a work of what might be considered metaphilosophy, addressing the question of what Anselm was "up to" overall, what motivated his intellectual activity. Sweeney's answer, developed in detail and at length, is that, in all of his work, Anselm is engaged in a kind of struggle. He desires intimacy with God, but is stymied by his own sin and ignorance. He is deeply committed to faith in rational argument as the way towards God, but painfully aware of the limitations and failures of his abilities. The philosopher who knows Anselm only from some second-hand sketch of the Proslogion argument might be surprised at this thesis, but those who have read Anselm know that he mixes argument and prayer with an ease and a consistency that show that, as he develops his philosophical project, he takes to the two to be intimately connected.

Sweeney offers a thorough analysis of how individual works of various sorts reflect this pattern. So, for example, she shows how the prayers demonstrate a sort of pendulum motion from the depths of alienation from God and His saints to an almost personal intimacy. She notes that in many of the Monologion arguments Anselm begins by posing what at first look to be insoluble dilemmas concerning the nature of the divine. Then he uses careful analysis to solve them, but ends with the thought that the human mind cannot really encompass the solutions. Or again, Anselm begins the Proslogion with an almost excessive optimism -- he will prove by a single, simple argument roughly everything we want to say about God, starting with His existence. But having apparently succeeded, Anselm reverses himself and cries that God is unattainable. Sweeney finds this back and forth pattern in almost all of Anselm's writings, and her cumulative argument is persuasive. Her work will be valuable in a variety of ways to philosophers and scholars approaching Anselm from many different perspectives. I focus below on examples of how Sweeney's book can help those of us who hope to understand Anselm's arguments and philosophize with him.

Sweeney begins at the beginning, with Anselm's early prayers and meditations, and carefully canvasses everything he wrote, including his letters, in roughly chronological order, highlighting throughout the theme of the limited creature seeking the barely accessible God. This thoroughness, along with the extensive bibliography, make the book an excellent source for what issues Anselm discusses (it is also helpful to see what he does not discuss -- like political philosophy), where he discusses them, and where to find what subsequent scholars have said. Further, it allows Sweeney to give an authoritative negative answer to the question of whether or not Anselm's views changed in a major way over time, a critical issue for the student of Anselm who hopes to use a point made in one work to illuminate a point made in another.

Moreover, Sweeney's approach is very sensitive to the literary and cultural milieu in which Anselm is working and very sensitive to the language and style in which he chooses to couch his arguments. Some philosophers might be tempted to dismiss such "historical" and "rhetorical" concerns, but one who hopes to understand Anselm would do well to consider the insights Sweeney's approach provides. For example, Sweeney lays some important groundwork for evaluating the Proslogion argument by setting out and elaborating on a common assumption in Anselm's day, that there is a "logic of hierarchy", that is "the notion that some things are better than others and that we can say with some certainty what some of those are." (156).

Even the scholar used to reading Anselm in the Latin might have missed some of his rhetorical devices. Sweeney notes that Anselm frequently juxtaposes words which sound similar, but have meanings which are opposite, or at least convey tension, to highlight what he takes to be an important opposition. The less sensitive reader might have failed to appreciate the opposition, and hence not grasped what Anselm intended, had this device not been made clear. On a larger scale, Sweeney's case that Anselm is engaged in a struggle which plays out rhetorically as a swing from portraying some crucial claim as prima facie almost impossible, to demonstrating its necessity, then often ending with the caveat that we have not truly grasped what we were seeking, allows the student to appreciate the macro-structure of Anselm's arguments. That, in turn, casts light on each argument and each premise.

Stepping back even further, to survey the whole Anselmian corpus, Sweeney's thesis underscores an important philosophical point about Anselm's work which the philosopher focusing on this or that argument might miss entirely. One of the great fault lines along which philosophers divide is over the reason to do philosophy to begin with. Some hope to discover certitude and to have the absolute imprimatur of reason on their basket of beliefs. Some find it pays well and is more fun than being an attorney. But some – among them Plato and Aristotle, Augustine and Aquinas -- do philosophy in order to help them to lead the good and happy life. Doing philosophy is the path one travels to seek the goal of human existence. One who isolated this or that Anselmian argument might be fooled by his analytic approach into thinking that he is in the philosophy business just to solve discreet, entertaining puzzles. Sweeney's book gives the lie to that conclusion. She demonstrates that Anselm's most analytic arguments are motivated by the same concerns, and even follow the same patterns, as the most passionate prayers. Anselm clearly falls on the "good and happy life" side of the divide. This is informative historically, but is also of interest in debating the perennial question of why we should bother to do philosophy. It shows that there is no deep tension between taking an analytic approach and yet philosophizing because you believe your life depends on it.

There are matters to complain about regarding Sweeney's book. Some readers may find that she assumes rather too much background knowledge. One not familiar with the intellectual milieu of Anselm's day might wonder just what "grammar" and "logic" meant at the time, or what the issue with the "filioque clause" was. And more discussion of Anselm's possible sources would have been enlightening. Augustine takes it that we are to seek a God who is beyond our capacities. Augustine is the most important philosophical influence on Anselm. Does Anselm embrace Augustine's approach wholesale, or does he depart from it in various ways? This theme of apparent contradiction is developed even more by Scotus Eriugena, who is closer to Anselm than Augustine was in both time and space. But Eriugena's way of putting things makes it seem that he is sometimes pushing the envelope of orthodoxy. Was Anselm influenced by Eriugena at all? If so, how? If not, is it because he did not have access to Eriugena's work, or did he deliberately choose to ignore it? The reader would be interested to know, and Sweeney's thoroughness in looking at all of Anselm's written work would put her in a position to address the question, but she does not mention it. Nevertheless, her work is careful in the details, persuasive in the overall thesis, and constitutes a significant contribution to Anselm scholarship.