Anthropology, History and Education

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Immanuel Kant, Anthropology, History and Education, Günter Zöller and Robert Louden (eds.), Cambridge University Press, 2008, 597pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521452502.

Reviewed by Amelie Rorty, Boston University


This collection of Kant's reflective essays on human nature -- its history and future prospects, its uniformity and variety, its achievements and foibles -- covers the period from 1764 to 1803. The essays range from book reviews and notes for physicians to "Lectures of Pedagogy" (1803) and "Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View" (1798). To those who know Kant primarily from the complexly structured and abstract arguments of the Critiques, these essays come as a surprise. In contrast to the conceptual apparatus articulated in the Critiques, they are full of detailed observations, empirical speculations, and pithy, shrewd -- even homely -- practical suggestions. Most of the essays are 'pragmatic' rather than -- in Kant's technical sense -- 'practical.' They characterize and counsel a wide range of human activities, ranging from advice on the systematic and principled methods of empirical observation to maxims on how best to control the exercise of the imagination in art and ordinary life. For instance, having distinguished the productive and reproductive imagination, and analyzed various principles of the association of ideas in the Anthropology, Kant notes

It is not advisable to praise a person too highly before one wishes to introduce him into a social gathering for the first time; on the contrary, it can often be a malicious trick on the part of a rogue to make him seem ridiculous. For the power of imagination raises the representation of what is expected so high that the person can only suffer by comparison. (Anthropology 7:173)

The views expressed in these essays are sometimes as surprising as their scope and detail. The high-minded enlightenment rationalism that emerged in the first two Critiques as a transcendental regulative 'Idea' is introduced as a guiding principle for an historical process of human development. The moral autonomy -- the rational morality of self-legislation -- that is the fulfillment of human nature is argued to be approached historically, painstakingly by many unexpected twists and turns of human effort. "The human being can only become human through education." (Lectures of Pedagogy 9:443) Education -- the gradual and disciplined development of the individual in the work of civilizing culture -- is to be directed through (and beyond) prudence to the development of a moral consciousness and disposition. But since "Providence has not placed [the precepts of government and education] already finished in [man]", they are among the most difficult human and precarious achievements. (LP 9:446) Dependent as they are on incremental multi-generational transmission, they presuppose the very skills and principles they attempt to achieve. "Who shall educate the educators? Who shall have governed the Sovereigns?" Having raised a general theoretical question, Kant again proceeds to give specific homely advice: parents ought to educate their children to think in general terms, for the future and beyond their immediate prudential concerns. Since this is no easy matter, experiments in public education are necessary. (LP 9:449-453) Again Kant offers specific counsel: unlike private schools that tend to reinforce self-interest, public schools enable children to learn to respect the rights of others.

Like many of the essays in this volume, "Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim" is of considerable historical significance, providing material for understanding the relation between Kant's wide ranging philosophic interests and the concerns of his contemporaries. It is also as prescient as it is forthright, setting many of the fundamental questions that have continued to preoccupy political historians and philosophers of history. Is there a history of humankind that can properly be called universal, in contrast to the chronicles of individual polities or nations? Does such a history -- construed as an explanatory narrative -- indicate anything that can be called "development"? If so, what is its structure, its rationale and direction? How are we to understand the destructive and bloody upheavals that constitute so much of human experience? What are the connections between economic, political and moral history? What is the relation between the rule of law in the nation state and the advancement of a universal political order? Can the development of individual rationality be compatible with the need for the constraints of political order? Does the study of history convey any philosophical insight? Can it give political guidance? What, if anything, can a philosophic history contribute to the emergence of human freedom?

Like the other essays in this volume, Kant's "Idea for a Universal History" reveals the astonishing range of his knowledge. It consists of a remarkable set of nine propositions which subtly and implicitly express -- and recast -- some of the philosophical sources of his views: the voices of the Stoics and Augustine are heard clearly; and although Kant has reservations about Grotius, Hobbes, Leibniz and Rousseau, their contributions -- along with those of Mandeville and Adam Smith -- are manifest. It is as if this essay were a crucible in which Kant hopes to synthesize the purified and transformed views of his predecessors, condensing them into a comprehensive political and cultural history with a philosophical moral. It is itself an instance of the integration of history and philosophical reflection that it heralds. Yet ironically, the influential aftermath of the essay was, in its turn, as diverse as its origins. It provides the impetus of Hegel's philosophy of history, Marx's reaction to that theory, Freud's view of the role of human aggression in the development of rational sociability, Darwin's emphasis on species evolution, and more recently, liberals' account of the role of rational deliberation in setting the grounds for political legitimacy. Taken together, Kant's philosophic ancestry, his own central work and his philosophical descendants set the major problems and themes of contemporary political theory.[1]

Kant's energetic erudition is by no means limited to the history of philosophy. The essays in this volume evince his active interests in the arts and aesthetics, in medicine and education, in (what was then) empirical psychology, physiology and anthropology. He had not only read the Roman historians and poets closely, but -- despite not knowing English -- he found a way to become familiar with the work of British essayists (Bacon, Chesterfield, Shaftesbury, Hume, The Spectator, Adam Smith) and French Encyclopedists (Buffon, Rousseau, D'Alembert, Diderot). While the tenor and direction of these essays are as universalist, rationalist and 'morally progressivist' as the views developed in the Critiques, they are filled with his detailed knowledge of local and historical differences. Kant is keenly interested in human diversity, in racial, sexual and age differences, and in the ways that cultural differences are self-perpetuating. He follows his usual mode of operation -- inscribe a domain (e.g. works of art), articulate its varieties (e.g. the sublime and the beautiful) and then map a wide range of distinctions onto differences (e.g. human sympathy and affection are beautiful; moral principle is sublime; the French and Italians have a feeling for the beauty of women and river valleys, while Germans and the British are moved by the sublimity of mankind and the Alps). Similarly, having characterized the human species phylogenetically, Kant proceeds to distinguish races (whites, Negroes, Huns and Hindus). He argues that because different races can procreate to produce mixed breeds (e.g. mulattos), they are not different sub-species. ("Of the Different Races of Human Beings" 2:430-2) "The class of whites is not distinguished from the class of the blacks as a special kind within the species; there are no different kinds of human beings." ("Determination of the Concept of a Human Race" 8:100) With his usual verve for speculation, Kant offers a functional conjecture to explain the origins of racial differences: in "the care of Nature [takes] to equip her creature … to preserve itself to be suited to the difference in climate or soil." ("Determination of the Concept of a Human Race" 2:434).

We have come to an embarrassing feature in Kant's thought. Although contemporary Kant scholars have found modifying and tempering clauses in his stereotypes, he was -- by our lights -- a racist and a sexist. He thought men are capable of rational morality, and while he acknowledged that their maxims need to be complemented by women's affectional sensitivity, he believed that the range of women's moral capacities is limited. Strictly speaking, they are not citizens; and while they are morally obliged to obey the law, to keep promises and to fulfill their obligations to their families, they are to remain subject to the judgment of their fathers and husbands. What seems worse to a contemporary moral sensibility, Kant gave no signs of thinking that these features of the species were in any way an impediment to his progressivist moral program. The natural moral development of the species (as such) does not ensure the full moral development of every individual nor, for that matter, any particular group of individuals.

This scholarly edition of Kant essays on human nature is the fifteenth volume to appear in the Cambridge Edition of the Work of Immanuel Kant. The translators -- Mary Gregory, Paul Guyer, Robert Louden, Holly Wilson, Allen Wood, Günter Zöller and Arnulf Zweig -- have tried to minimize interpretation, preserving literalness as much as possible. Although the standard of the translations seems uniformly high, the attempt to preserve the structure of Kant's paragraphs and sentences has meant that some essays seem wooden and awkward. There is a wealth of notes: Kant's own annotations are carefully distinguished from the editors' linguistic and informal explanatory notes. Because of its prohibitive cost, and because readable translations of the most important of these essays are available elsewhere, this book -- like many other Cambridge University Press volumes -- is likely to be used primarily by scholars working in major libraries.

[1] See "History as Philosophy," the Preface of Kant's Idea for a Universal History, ed. Amelie Rorty and James Schmidt (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009).