Anti-Individualism: Mind and Language, Knowledge and Justification

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Sanford C. Goldberg, Anti-Individualism: Mind and Language, Knowledge and Justification, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 280pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521880480.

Reviewed by Jonathan E. Adler, Brooklyn College/CUNY Graduate Center


In the last twenty five years or so, the epistemology of testimony has boomed and blossomed. To this now crowded field, Sanford Goldberg has made a major contribution. His book is thorough and packed with tight, clear, and in many cases, persuasive arguments. Anti-Individualism is the culmination and continuation of extended research and many important publications on the subject.

Goldberg's main thesis, as indicated by his sub-title, is that testimonial knowledge requires anti-individualism about mind, language, knowledge, and justification. As is usual, his anti-individualism goes along with an externalist view of content, anti-reductionism about the dependence of testimony on non-testimonial sources, and a reliabilist epistemology. But even where Goldberg takes up familiar positions, his arguments advance the field and introduce novelties.

An example of the latter occurs in Chapter 4, which defends the crucial move from public linguistic norms as governing testimony to anti-individualism about "speech content, linguistic meaning, and mental content/attitude individuation." (102) Without appeal to the semantics of speech/attitude reports and without exploiting subjects' ignorance about the relevant concepts, Goldberg imagines variation in public norms, while individualistic -- mental -- facts (about 'twins') remain constant. (103-4) The contents will vary accordingly, and so they cannot supervene on the individualistic facts. With this intricate argument set-out, Goldberg exposes serious costs of a 'hybrid' view which would be anti-individualist about meaning, but not mental content. At the close of this chapter, Goldberg shows that his arguments imply that semantic deference rests on our extensive and reliable dependence on the word of others, rather than, in a finely drawn contrast to Burge, that anti-individualism rests on deference.

Of its many valuable qualities, Goldberg's book takes little within testimonial epistemology for granted. Chapter 1 asks the basic question: Under what conditions does a hearer acquire knowledge or non-accidentally true belief from the testimony of another? Goldberg understands the necessary condition of "non-accidentally true belief" as reliably produced belief. His answer consists of three necessary conditions: (1) the reliability of the speaker; the reliability of the hearer to (2) recover the proposition expressed and to (3) discriminate among speakers for those who are reliable. Goldberg argues that a distinctive feature of testimonial knowledge, as contrasted to, say, inductive knowledge, is that

the total knowledge-relevant support enjoyed by the hearer H's testimonial belief outstrips the support provided by (one) the reasons hearer H had for trusting her source and (two) the proper functioning of H's cognitive system in the context in question. (33)

The additional feature of testimonial knowledge is H's dependence on the speaker's (S's) support for what he asserts.

Although Goldberg admirably refuses to take for granted most any doctrine within the testimonial knowledge field, he is more willing to just take on board general epistemological positions -- specifically, reliabilism as explicating the criterion that knowledge excludes luck and that this criterion is to be tested counterfactually. (26, 52) But most any case of inductive knowledge will have an element of luck, since there will always be future circumstances, outside of one's ken or reliable sources, that, were they to turn out otherwise, would render one's belief false. For example, Marcia believes that Mary has beautiful fresh sunflowers in her window today, which she has regularly seen there. But if on an unusual day, Mary would be unable to get fresh sunflowers, she would put perfect fakes in the window instead. Marcia would still believe that they were beautiful fresh sunflowers. Does it follow that on this normal day, it is accidental or luck that Marcia is right that there are fresh sunflowers in the vase? Those who answer affirmatively have to explain how they avoid either inductive or other kinds of scepticism, since this case is not at all way-out.

Goldberg assumes not only various epistemological views, but also various epistemological intuitions about cases. These decisions are apt given space and time limitations and that the views and intuitions he takes on board are the dominant ones. Still, there are costs.

His fake barn variants (which, along with 'twin' cases, pepper the text) involve, in one example, a hearer, who seeks testimony in a room full of liars, and luckily alights on the one reliable testifier. All else satisfactory, the hearer's testimonially formed belief is not knowledge: "he would have come to believe what he did, in the way that he did … , even under conditions in which what he believed was false." (30; see also 44, 50, 52, 64-65, 209-210) Aside from trenchant recent divergences from the dominant judgment, the fake barn case as a paradigm of epistemic luck is problematic. Unlike in the Gettier cases, which launched contemporary views of knowledge as non-accidental, the process that leads to the subject's belief (e.g. that I am looking at a real barn) originates in a lawlike way from the truth of that belief.

But the main worry is the immediate transfer of our dominant fake barns judgment to the testimonial setting. First, the surrounding liars case, which has been raised in other ways in the testimony literature, is puzzling for Goldberg's application. If the point of the example is, as stated, to rule out the credulous, how can the fake informants case help, given the parallel with the fake barns case? The stipulation is that the hearer is unable to discriminate the veracity of this reliable speaker (real barn) from the others (fake barns).

Second, the surrounding liars or other fake informants cases are of significance for the epistemology of testimony because, arguably, they highlight something distinctive about testimonial knowledge. The question about the barns is: Can X know that the building he is looking at is a barn, given that it is and so appears, yet it is surrounded by fakes? But the testimonial question is different: Can H know that p, given that p is asserted by S, who is reliable and so appears, yet S is surrounded by fake informants? The testimonial, unlike the perceptual, setting allows for a separation between knowing a proposition and knowing that its source is as it appears.

A different line of thinking to justify that this difference makes an epistemic difference is via trust, assuming that trusting S and knowing from his testimony are compatible. If trust is appropriate to the informant, even as a stranger, and trust is extended -- non-fungibly -- to a particular speaker, then when your trust is well placed in this speaker, why should the luck of having selected this one deny you testimonial knowledge? I do not endorse an affirmative answer, but it remains a live option, even if the dominant view of the fake barns case stands.

Chapter 2 is the longest chapter. It is a sustained defense of a single argument toward the conclusion that

There are public linguistic norms which … serve to determine the content asserted, and in reliance on which H recovers what was asserted. (41)

Of his last two, and key, premises for establishing this conclusion, (3) affirms that speakers sometimes successfully transmit testimonial knowledge to hearers, despite impoverished background knowledge of each other's beliefs. Premise (4), to which most space is devoted, holds that the gap that premise (3) leaves is filled by public linguistic norms. Only with such norms is successful communication possible when speakers and hearers have minimal background knowledge of one another, as with strangers.

In section 2.6.8, Goldberg attempts to strengthen his arguments against various attempts to explain reliable comprehension in minimal cases "without appeal to public linguistic norms." (73). Can H comprehend S's assertions if H's linguistic experience relevant to S's speech is supplemented by H's experience with other members of S's speech community? While Goldberg grants a wide overlap in word-forms between S and H's speech community, he vigorously denies the success of inferences from sameness of word-forms (plus contextual knowledge) to sameness of meaning -- that S's word-forms "mean precisely the same thing in S's mouth as they do in the mouths of other community members." (76)

What of Goldberg's very strong demand of meaning "precisely the same thing"? After all if meaning is at all grounded in conceptual role, differences in systems of belief are hardly expected to yield precise sameness of meaning. The "precise" sameness demand is defended in section 2.4, when Goldberg considers a response that will dodge his demand for public linguistic norms

reliable testimonial belief need only be such that what is believed is likely to be true given the reliability of the testimony proffered … . [S]o long as the hearer's belief is a belief in a content that is 'close enough' to what is actually said, then the belief in that 'close enough' content will likely be true, given the reliability of the source testimony. (44-45)

Yet, if my understanding of 'close enough' is correct, as concerned with internalist or narrow content, that view is compatible with loads of good communication. But I am not sure that my 'understanding' is correct, since Goldberg also holds that the 'close enough' model "denies that the hearer needs to recover how the speaker is representing the world to be." (46)

The cases I have in mind are typical vagueness ones in which my usage of, say, 'adult' includes older teenagers while yours does not; or, we differ in whether when I say "The dinner party starts at six," this allows for 5, 15, or 20 minute leeway. In other cases, the expected difference in uses of terms for broad concepts or natural kinds like 'love,' 'happiness,' or 'gold' reflect our varying individual ideas in numerous details, but where there is still wide overlaps in usage, and commonality of reference, due to shared deference to authorities. Our understandings in comprehension are close enough, so it seems to me, to allow for communication to go through for most practical purposes.

Another difficulty with Goldberg's appeal to public linguistic norms is a problem for reliabilism: Reliable linguistic norms can facilitate poor understanding. Take, for example, the tendency to draw implicatures from external negation over a predicate to internal ones (e.g. John does not believe that abortion is wrong to John believes that abortion is not wrong). This particular tendency is supported by pragmatics ('scalar implicatures'). Assume that this inference is reliable -- generally, speakers who assert the former intend the latter. So it is, in fact, a reliable basis for recovering speaker's meaning. Still, the reliability within confined contexts will generate a poor logical understanding -- a fallacy -- that external negation implies internal negation.

Implicatures are a neglected topic that Goldberg briefly and insightfully investigates in Chapter 3 (87-92). Goldberg asks whether, given the knowledge norm of assertion, the responsibility for an assertion is the same as for an implicature. Goldberg answers negatively on the plausible ground that in implicating that p by asserting q, S provides H with S's evidence (namely, q plus contextual assumptions and Gricean norms) for the implicated p. Consequently, S does not represent himself as in a privileged position with respect to p, let alone as knowing it.

Goldberg has articulated a crucial variable for distinguishing responsibility for assertions from that for implicatures, but it is not decisive. In the Gricean example Goldberg offers, S is asked if Smith is having an affair, and S responds "Well, he sure has been spending a lot of time with a certain woman in New York." Given certain further, evident, conditions, S is taken to implicate that "Smith is having an affair." Now Goldberg is right that the speaker does not represent himself as knowing the latter. Still, he comes close, for a hearer could legitimately ask 'How do you know that if Smith is spending a lot of time with a certain woman in New York, he is having an affair with her?' If the speaker replies "I did not say I know its" the hearer has reason to regard the inference as only to the qualified "I'm pretty sure that [or, Probably,] Smith is having an affair."

Correlatively, Goldberg's diagnosis does not work as well for standard -- required and unqualified -- implicatures. For such cases, compare Goldberg's examples with a slight variant of Sperber and Wilson's (Relevance, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1986):

S: Would you drive a Mercedes?

H: I wouldn't drive ANY expensive car.

H expects S to know that a Mercedes is an expensive car. So S concludes that H implicated that he wouldn't drive a Mercedes. Contrary to Goldberg, Sperber and Wilson comment that

The strongest possible implicatures are those … which must actually be supplied if the interpretation is to be consistent [with] the principle of relevance, and for which the speaker takes full responsibility. (199)

Grant that in Goldberg's case, the hearer's challenge 'How do you know that Smith is having an affair?' is inappropriate because the speaker does not so represent himself. But in Sperber and Wilson's more standard case of implicature, the analogous challenge is inappropriate for a very different reason -- roughly, a violation of Quantity, since given the obviousness of the contextually less informative implicature, the challenge is properly directed only to the original, stronger, assertion.

Goldberg's interest in implicatures is as an in-road to his central topic of the apportionment of blame for speaker-hearer misunderstanding

at least one of the parties is appropriately blamed for the breakdown in communication, and that … warranted ascriptions of blame presuppose public linguistic norms. (83)

I do not accept Goldberg's starting point -- that there is always blame between speaker and hearer for misunderstanding. When someone appeared ill, I offered aid, but told the person "I am an EMT. With your permission, I could try to help. But I am not a doctor." Now the last sentence appears to be a lie, and even if not, it is bound to mislead the listener to think that it would be wrong to refer to me as "Dr. Adler." It seems to me there is misunderstanding -- and expected or anticipated misunderstanding -- yet neither of us is to blame. It is easy to manufacture even simpler examples, as with using 'or' where you allow that both disjuncts are true, but the hearer reasonably understands it as exclusive usage. The shared public linguistic norms do not settle how to balance brevity, precision, and expectations due to common knowledge or circumstances, and it would be a disastrous burden on conversation if we did attempt to work out or apply an exact formula in real time.

Goldberg's interest in the 'blame game' is strategic, not moralistic. He takes blame-attributions to be worthwhile in any complex system subject to evaluation of its parts for their contribution to the system's serving its function. Should the propositional contents over which the speaker has given her word be identified with what the speaker meant or said? Goldberg's answer is the latter. Since sentence meaning clearly depends on public linguistic norms, such norms will settle questions of blame (92-3). A speaker says 'President Bush is in Galveston, Texas, today,' but meant by 'Galveston' 'Houston,' and it is Houston where President Bush is today. What the speaker literally said justifies the hearer's blame upon discovering its falsity. The conclusion is that "it is sentence meaning, not speaker meaning" that is the locus of blame. The literal interpretation is yielded by public linguistic norms, so that, Goldberg concludes, the 'blame game,' when communication fails for misunderstanding, depends on such norms. (The argument assumes, however, that if H is entitled to blame S for A, then S is blameworthy for doing A.)

In part II, Goldberg concentrates on epistemological issues. Here, with qualifications, he defends his three necessary conditions for testimonial knowledge above as sufficient, along with a reliabilist analysis of testimonial knowledge (or justification). The defense is thereby a defense of a "strong version of epistemic externalism," implying that a subject S's testimonial knowledge "depends on factors pertaining to the cognitive lives of subjects other than S." (134) Goldberg intends this defense to lead to the conclusion that fundamental epistemic notions like knowledge, warrant, justification and rationality involve "reference to factors in the individual subject's social environment." (135) So, for example, in Chapter 5, Goldberg proposes a 'twins' case, where both 'twins' receive the same testimony, one from a knowledgeable speaker and the other not. The former comes to know (or to be warranted in believing), but not the other. The difference is made by a social factor, a difference in their respective 'social peers'.

The value of viewing testimony within a social epistemology is most evident in Chapter 8, where Goldberg confronts the gullibility charge cast against testimonial knowledge for young children. Goldberg shows that the rich, empirical literature supports the charge only as applied to very young children, since cognitive development or greater empirical knowledge leading to a more critical trust takes place between ages three and four.

Earlier (Chapter 6), Goldberg first addressed gullibility as an objection to anti-reductionism for endorsing warrant to accept testimony without any checks on the informant. The evident response that Goldberg employs is that the default entitlement to believe the word of another requires an ability to discriminate among informants ((3) above) for those who are reliable. Still, in the unlucky counterfactual case such a hearer would unreliably accept (false/bad) testimony as well. (162-3) In response, Goldberg adopts, as an externalist requirement, something like the condition that the hearer recognize tell-tale signs of speaker untrustworthiness (166). In arguing for this condition, Goldberg interestingly draws a comparison to a reliability-monitoring mechanism in recollection, whereby automatically, sub-consciously, and regularly, incoherences expose false memories. Such a process, whether for memory or for testimony, must exist as a solution to the frame problem, which requires that agents ignore what is irrelevant without so judging it.

Goldberg is well positioned to answer the gullibility problem as applied to even very young children because on an anti-reductionist default view, the child only needs reasons not to accept, while a reductionist one enters the stronger demand for positive reasons -- some non-testimonial -- to accept. How, though, can the anti-reductionist, who recognizes the children's credulity, defend testimonial knowledge transfer to young children? Is not their credulity, even when suitably qualified, an admission of defeaters, as in fake informant cases? Goldberg's answer (234) is that young children's acquisition of testimonial knowledge depends on the full social environment of the child, not the child's resources alone.

Even given his limited ability to discriminate reliable testifiers, the young child can come to know by testimony in the restrictive conditions of his social environments. (220) The child's guardian enhances the child's reliability by restricting the child's environments to trustworthy informants and by responding critically to the child's assertions. This is not incidental, but a feature of the child's method or reliability, so it must be held constant across counterfactual variations. (224-5) Consequently, Goldberg predicts that false testimony reaches children far less than expected, and that our judgments of cases as to whether a child acquires testimonial knowledge with unreliable testifiers will vary depending on the vigilance of her guardians.

Surprisingly, not only is the young child's testimonial knowledge secured by reliance on his social environment, but the rationality of hearers generally is protected by the social system. Goldberg, in Chapter 7, engages the issue as a problem for anti-reductionism: the hearer who acquires his belief by testimony is allegedly not in a position to assess the evidence available to the testifier. Consequently, there is a threat to the ascription of rationality for beliefs based on such testimony, since the hearer is not in a position to check on whether the chain-originator is monitoring his environment for further relevant evidence.

Goldberg's own response to the rationality challenge is to propose a socially based view of belief-policing as an improvement on the coherence monitoring test defended earlier, whereby the hearer utilizes other speakers to compensate for her inability to police the evidence of her informant. No special effort is required by the hearer to realize this epistemic benefit -- merely asserting her new belief to others will often be enough to subject it to critical social scrutiny and for it to benefit from responses within the 'marketplace of ideas.'

Still, the open question or problem is a traditional one as to whether testimonial knowledge is epistemically weak or inferior to other kinds because of this essential distance from the original evidence. Goldberg offers a 'twin' case, which is a partial concession to this traditional concern and effective against the attempt to allay the worry by distinguishing between warrant and justification, whereby one twin recalls the reasons for her belief and the other does not. (186-189) Goldberg argues that the one who remembers is in a better epistemic position than the one who does not, especially in regard to recognizing putative counter-evidence, which leads him back to the socially based policing role.

While this view works against its immediate target, what if it is epistemically good to lose one's reasons or evidence? The problem of rationality above appears exaggerated because it is the nature of testimony to borrow another's evidence, so that Goldberg rightly wonders why the hearer's rationality should be thought at all impugned. Goldberg presents an example to show that an analogous, if less usual, problem affects knowledge by memory. But then why does the advantage go with the reason-maintaining hearer in Goldberg's example? We have limited cognitive storage capacity, and, arguably, this limitation is not one that should be idealized away when representing our epistemic problematic. But the loss of one's reasons or evidence is also an epistemic good because once a belief is accepted on the evidence, it is detached from that evidence, expressive of one's epistemic self-trust or authority. There is a fundamental parallel with testimony: Even if, when asserting that p, a speaker represents himself as having adequate reasons to know that p, the core setting is one in which the speaker does not present his reasons or evidence, but only upon a legitimate challenge. The hearer's acceptance of testimony from the speaker without learning the speaker's reasons expresses trust or authority in the speaker.

The critical comments I have offered about Goldberg's claims and arguments have been narrowly focused with indications of a broad worry that he takes too quickly on board some general epistemological doctrines. Goldberg is too willing to accept the dialectically advantageous standard contrasts between anti-reductionist or externalist views and reductionist or internalist ones.

Internalism is an easy target. First, internalism about content is not clearly separated from epistemic internalism, a conflation which Goldberg does not commit. Second, internalism is understood as holding that "all of the materials that make for one's being justified in accepting a piece of testimony are discernible through one's searching reflection." (135, 154). In a long footnote (5, 135-137) Goldberg argues for its preferability to variants. With this internalism in place, the profoundly influential Kripke-Putnam-Burge arguments for semantic and mental content externalism, which Goldberg develops, are close to decisive reasons to reject epistemic internalism. And then the various ways our testimonial knowledge depends on a social or community network of support, which individuals cannot directly access, exposes internalism as hardly in the ball game. Yet, Goldberg does not treat internalism as hopeless, as is evident from his extended, respectful critique of some internalist and reductionist views. Still, his understanding of internalism invites the dismissal.

Internalism is traditionally the unremarkable view that for one's belief to be justified is for one to have sufficient reasons or evidence for it. The reshaping of internalism arose as a response to contemporary externalism with paradigm examples like that of the thermometer. The key claim was that knowledge, warrant, or, less usually, justification depends only on whether the belief was the outcome of a lawlike, reliable, or causal process to the truth of the belief, regardless of whether the believer is at all reflectively sensitive to this connection, let alone has reason to believe it reliable (etc.). Now if this externalism is fundamental, internalism does not require reflective access. The contrast with externalism is sustained if one's relevant beliefs are reason-responsive (to borrow a prominent phrase from the compatibilist literature) regardless of whether one is aware of, has access to, or is in control of those workings. Isn't it in any case clear that even in paradigmatic cases of the appeal to reasons, as with arguments, that the reasons presented are only the tip of the iceberg of the believer's full set of reasons, much of which is inaccessible background that shapes the structure and responses of his corpus of beliefs?

With a less consciousness-demanding notion of internalism in place, a number of the blunt objections to internalism (or reductionism) dissolve. The epistemology of testimony is especially inviting to internalism, since it is so dependent on sophisticated, though usually effortless, judgments of e.g. trust and trustworthiness, which do not hold for perception or memory. The internalist (or reductionist), like the externalist, can agree that the warrant for an individual to accept testimony is dependent on the reliable workings of circumstances, especially social ones, outside his control or conscious grasp. For one obvious consequence, it explains why you have good reason to be more hesitant in accepting testimony in a foreign community with very different social structures than the one you are accustomed to, where testimony is by-and-large correct and there are tight social constraints, customs, and upbringing for informants to be trustworthy and reliable.

Goldberg's book is an important contribution to philosophy of language and mind, as well as epistemology. For anyone who is, or aspires to be, a serious participant in the epistemology of testimony it is a 'must study.'[1]

[1] I am grateful to Goldberg for his valuable comments.