Anxiety: A Philosophical History

Anxiety A Philosophical History

Bettina Bergo, Anxiety: A Philosophical History, Oxford University Press, 2020, 538pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780197539712.

Reviewed by David R. Cerbone, West Virginia University


More than once in the introduction to this book, Bettina Bergo warns that she will be offering a “simplified narrative” (4, 33). By the time I reached page 478—the last page of the text proper, which is followed by a nearly twenty page bibliography—I found myself wondering, “With simplification like this, who needs complicated?” While perhaps simplified, this is by no means a simple book, as the reader is led through a thicket of philosophical figures, whose work spans several centuries, along with assorted figures and work in medicine, psychiatry, and the life-sciences. To be fair, there is some merit in Bergo’s characterization of her narrative: after briefly acknowledging anxiety’s appearance in early Greek and Roman philosophy (e.g., Plato’s Symposium and the writings of the Stoics), she declares the starting point of her history of anxiety to be Kant’s philosophy (with references to Descartes and Spinoza for good measure). Hers is thus a modern history, which tracks the career of, in a word, anxiety, but what this admittedly simplified history reveals is just how complicated things are when it comes to what that single word designates. As she notes in recounting her just-completed narrative, anxiety is something “eminently polymorphous: anxiety as simultaneously an affect, an idea, a sign or symptom, and as occupying a spectrum of intensities that span sensation and emotions” (438).

Before tracing out some of that complexity—and so recounting some of the key elements of Bergo’s narrative—let me first address the question, “Why?” Why, that is, devote so much energy and ink to a history—a philosophical history, no less—of anxiety? There is, I suppose, always the mountain climber’s answer, the resolutely uninformative “Because it’s there.” And there is something to that answer after all: even cursory attention to philosophy and adjacent fields in the 19th and 20th centuries shows anxiety to be a recurring theme, and one to which a great deal of significance is often accorded. So it seems natural to ask, “What’s up with all that?” Answering this last question gets us beyond the mere thereness of the notion to what kind of work it is supposed to do. At the risk of adding further simplification, the succinct answer regarding the significance of anxiety is its promise for reconfiguring—or even helping us to get over or past—the mind-body problem. For Bergo, what is attractive about anxiety is precisely its shape-shifting, border-crossing character, its resistance to containment in any of the standard, largely dichotomous philosophical categories such as mental and physical, psychological and physiological, thought and feeling. Anxiety’s affective intensity reveals the porousness of these categories, while also providing a kind of glue that welds them together.

The book consists of nine chapters, each of which is devoted to a single philosophical figure (although Heidegger is accorded two chapters). These chapters are flanked by an introduction on the front end and, at the back end, a conclusion and a very brief epilogue. The introduction and conclusion offer a concise forecast and recapitulation of the main narrative. As a result, there is a fair amount of repetition between these two sections. However, given the length and complexity of Bergo’s discussion, such repetition is hardly unwelcome: by the time I reached the conclusion, it was helpful to be reminded of how the earliest chapters hung together with the late ones that were still fresh in my mind. Interspersed throughout the nine main chapters are three “Excurses” that veer away from the main focus on anxiety and, with two of the excurses, away from philosophy proper. The first excursus does include attention to Hegel, but a great deal of it concerns Philippe Pinel, a 19th century psychiatrist who introduced humane and rationalizing techniques into the care of the mentally ill; the second focuses on Darwin, while the third provides nothing less than “an introduction to Husserl’s thought” (319).

As noted, Kant’s critical philosophy provides the starting point for Bergo’s philosophical history. Starting with Kant makes for a long lead-up to Bergo’s main concerns, as anxiety is not a central topic in his philosophy. Instead, Kant’s critical philosophy serves as a kind of inflection point, straddling as it does the “early” period of modern philosophy and the later, well, post-Kantian period. Looking toward his predecessors, Kant’s philosophy is concerned to curb the metaphysical excesses of substance dualism (not just Descartes’, but also Swedenborg’s “spirit-seeing” fanaticism). Kant’s efforts on this front give way to new tensions, which are especially evident across the first Critique: on the one hand, Kant argues famously in the B Deduction for the necessity of the “I think” as a possible accompaniment to any of my representations (that attachability is what makes the representation mine); however, in the Paralogisms, Kant denies that the self (or soul) is a possible object of knowledge. We are thus left with a purely formal notion of the self, which leaves little room for the idea of a feeling subject. And yet—and here is a further tension—in his practical philosophy, Kant finds it necessary to recur to at least some forms of feeling even while consigning most to the animalistic category of inclination, viz., the feeling of reverence or respect for the moral law. While anxiety is not one of Kant’s topics, Bergo detects a kind of anxiousness in Kant’s account, which sets the stage for anxiety’s emergence as a central topic.

That emergence is by no means sudden: the subsequent chapter (leaving aside the excursus on Hegel and Pinel) concerns Schelling and the focus is on Sehnsuchtyearning or longing, to which Bergo appends the qualifier “anxious” (oddly, Bergo notes that in Schelling’s later work, Sehnsucht is replaced by Angst, while declaring nonetheless that she will focus on the earlier writings, most notably, the 1809 Philosophical Inquiries into the Nature of Human Freedom). The Schelling chapter struck me as, in a word, trippy. Despite Schelling’s concern to develop a more monistic metaphysics oriented around the concept of life—a promising approach for centering the affects, including anxiety—his concern with singular living organisms is set within a speculative cosmology and cosmogony pervaded by those same life-forces. Anxious longing is not just a feature of living things, but the cosmos as a whole (including God): “The first movement of desire within the Absolute, whereby the Absolute metaphorically mirrors and concentrates itself, is similarly found in humans and in nature” (120). For her part, Bergo seems comfortable describing Schelling as tracing “the organic emergence of the absolute in the birth of God out of God’s self” (446), but I cannot do much with such formulations.

Apart from making life a principal philosophical concern, Schelling is important for Bergo as a precursor to Kierkegaard, whose appearance roughly one hundred pages into the book marks the appearance of anxiety in its more recognizable form. In Kierkegaard’s 1844 The Concept of Anxiety, we get “the first existential presentation of affective intensity, from anxious awaiting to anguished despair” (133). Anxiety is more clearly psychologized in Kierkegaard, rather than ascribed to mysterious cosmic forces. More importantly, anxiety is linked in a fundamental way to the very idea of (becoming) a self. Anxiety signifies the individual’s being open to possibilities, whose manifestation can be the occasion of both despair and its overcoming through faith. Kierkegaard’s dialectics are significant also for veering away from the formal philosophical methods that inform German idealism: Kierkegaard’s “new dialectics of affect” are “communicated through myth and narrative” (135), in contrast to the formal “dialectics of reason” that preoccupies idealism, which “offered so little space to affects in their lived immediacy” (134).

Following her discussion of Kierkegaard, Bergo embarks on her second “excursus,” which concerns Darwin’s 1872 The Expression of the Emotions in Man and Animals. Anxiety takes something of a break here, as it merits only one brief mention in Darwin’s work, where he confesses to being “confounded” by anxiety because of its lack of unambiguous expression. Instead, the excursus focuses on Darwin’s work insofar as it serves to naturalize the emotions—linking human affects to the expressive lives of animals—and universalize them as well: the characteristic expressions of fear, pleasure, suffering, and grief can be found cross-culturally and across “the races.” Bergo is thus keen to document Darwin’s take on the debates of his time over whether the emergence of human beings was polygenic or monogenic, as it is only with the latter that the emotions can be accorded universal significance.

While Schopenhauer, like Schelling before him, retains more than a whiff of cosmic excess—the idea of a Will lurking beneath the striving of what appear to be distinct individual wills—Bergo cites his importance for introducing “the body, sexuality, and, most important of all, suffering as the basic condition of living beings” (201). Thus, for “the first time in late idealism . . . a philosophic system begins from a moving and embodied subject, and ‘beneath’ it, from what has to be called an a posteriori metaphysics” (201). Anxiety is not exactly front and center—Schopenhauer’s cycle of life is one of suffering, a recurring pattern of desire and (occasionally) satiation, followed by more suffering (whether in the form of further desire or merely boredom)— but Bergo sees it lurking in these canonical formulations, as “we certainly experience something like a will-to-live. We feel it as anxiety and suffering” (238).

As the author of The Gay Science, one might think that Nietzsche would not figure prominently in a narrative on anxiety. As far as I can tell, Nietzsche never discusses anxiety explicitly, nor does Bergo quote Nietzsche as doing so. Nonetheless, Bergo sees Nietzsche as a pivotal figure in his limning of the more subterranean physiological dimensions of our affective lives. Nietzsche, more than any of the previous philosophers in Bergo’s narrative, is a philosopher of the body, the misunderstanding of which is for Nietzsche the source of so many philosophical errors (see § 2 of the Preface to the 2nd edition of The Gay Science). In this way, Nietzsche goes further even than Kierkegaard:

While Kierkegaard identified anxiety as the first affect in the contemporary sense of what impacts us, bodily and pre-reflectively, but which can also be a passion, Nietzsche arguably radicalizes this strategy—notably in his concepts of ressentiment and the Augenblick (moment) of joyous affirmation. (244)

Notice here that Bergo’s induction of Nietzsche into her historical narrative involves reading anxiety into the affects Nietzsche does emphasize. Here, Bergo follows Max Scheler’s reading of Nietzsche, which equates ressentiment and anxiety. I’m not sure what to make of this equivalence, as ressentiment involves feelings of envy and hatred rather than anything we would normally associate with anxiety; there is, for example, nothing of Kierkegaard’s notion of being held out into possibilities, and so nothing in ressentiment that attests to our fundamental freedom. But perhaps this can be construed as another example of anxiety’s “polymorphous” character, another way of shifting its shape when viewed from one philosophical perspective rather than another. Apart from ressentiment, Nietzsche’s idea of eternal recurrence figures centrally as the occasion for anxiety: the demon’s words in The Gay Science invite an anxious gnashing of teeth, but also, more positively, a longing for the truth of what the demon forecasts. It is unclear to me just what Bergo takes the status of eternal recurrence to be. At some points, she treats it (rightly, in my view) as having only the form of an imperative to live a life one could will to recur eternally, whereas elsewhere she treats it as a metaphysical thesis whereby “eternal recurrence dissolves conceptions of time as line or vector” (360). I likewise found her handling of Nietzsche’s notion of the death of God to be more than a little puzzling, owing to her desire to read Nietzsche in conversation with Hegel’s prior discussion of God’s death. Indeed, she goes so far as to claim that “Nietzsche’s proclamation almost flows from Hegel’s Philosophy of Religion, as the moment when all dialectics tremble” (262). This strikes me as pretty odd, and more than a little forced, as it seems to turn on an equivocation concerning the “death of God.” Earlier in the chapter, Bergo herself refers to the death of God as synonymous for Nietzsche with “the decline of religious faith” in Europe, an event whose advent coincides with the advent of modernity and whose slow unfolding Nietzsche seeks to document and whose effects he measures and projects. But the death of God in this sense is clearly not what weighs on Hegel, as the event whose meaning he interrogates is that of the Crucifixion—the death of Jesus, the incarnated God—which is followed (and presumably redeemed) by the Resurrection. So it is not at all clear how “Nietzsche’s proclamation” “flows” (although Bergo is careful to hedge this with an enigmatic “almost”) from Hegel, as the Madman’s proclamation in § 125 of The Gay Science seems to be about something else entirely. To be sure, Nietzsche is interested in the psycho-dynamics of Christianity, whose estimation of humanity’s debt requires for its expiation the sacrifice of God himself; but that is not what is at issue in The Gay Science.

The next chapter, on Freud, is the one non-excursus chapter devoted to a thinker whose work is clearly philosophical, but who stands outside of philosophy proper (Freud saw himself far more as a scientist and doctor than a philosopher). But Freud clearly warrants inclusion in the central line of Bergo’s narrative, as anxiety is interwoven throughout his work from its inception to its latest iterations. Bergo accordingly traces out the several ways in which Freud treats anxiety, starting from “the unfolding of anxiety from Freud’s materialist neurological Project through his attempt to set anxiety apart from neurasthenia and hysteria” (277) in the early phases of Freud’s career to his later speculations concerning “the origin of anxiety” in relation to the “two drives, life and death, that were intertwined and simultaneously came under the ego’s sway and escaped it,” and ending with how “Freud’s identification of anxiety with the physiological upheaval of birth set the affect at the very incipience of the ego as an organized part of the bodily unconscious, or id” (277). For Bergo, Freud’s work illustrates anxiety’s bridging character, as it is “physically rooted,” while at the same time being “the fundamental affect emerging at the dynamic intersection of body and mind, with an ability to attach itself to an idea, whether proximate or distant.” (285) Anxiety is seemingly everywhere in Freud’s work, taking on new forms and playing new roles: repression, trauma, the interplay of libido and death, and our very births. Yet there are for Bergo fatal shortcomings in Freud’s analyses: inscribed within them is a “circle of anxiety” that closes “around the psychoanalytic approach, otherwise so fecund in its comprehension of affective life” (459).

Following the third and final excursus on Husserl, that Heidegger is accorded two chapters indicates his significance within Bergo’s overall narrative. As with Kierkegaard before him (whose influence Heidegger only grudgingly acknowledges in Being and Time), anxiety (Angst) is front and center in the architectonic of Being and Time. Heidegger’s account of Angst emphasizes its affective character—Angst is above all a mood—and its significance: it is a fundamental mood (a Grundstimmung). What makes anxiety fundamental is its capacity to reveal something basic about Dasein’s existence, its “that it is and has to be” in the manner of projecting into possibilities. As revelatory of Dasein’s being-possible, anxiety is unsettling insofar as it attests to the unsettled character of our existence. Heidegger is also especially important for Bergo insofar as we see in his account of anxiety a development of both its existential and metaphysical significance: anxiety holds Dasein out into the nothing of its transcendence, thereby animating the question, “Why is there something rather than nothing?” Although Bergo treats “Heidegger’s hermeneutic of anxiety” as “a decisive contribution to our unified being-in-the-world,” her discussion of Heidegger is sharply critical as well. What bothers her here is Heidegger’s reluctance to confront the bodily dimensions of Dasein’s existence, which indicates a kind of backsliding relative to the trajectory of Bergo’s narrative, as well as his insistence on a sharp separation between Dasein’s way of being and that of animals. As someone who has grappled with Heidegger’s squeamishness about the body on more than one occasion, I see many of Bergo’s worries and criticisms to be well-taken (Cerbone 2000, 2013). When it comes to animality, however, it is worth remembering that Kierkegaard before Heidegger draws a pretty sharp line between the human and the animal. As he notes in The Sickness unto Death, the possibility of despair is “man’s advantage over the beast,” and the same could be said for anxiety as well: both are affects that affect the self, which is only an issue for human beings. Thus, when Bergo says that Heidegger should have recognized the way, for example, “aphasic anxiety leaves [Dasein] scarcely distinguishable from other animals” (394), that sounds completely wrong: Dasein’s aphasia is thoroughly distinguishable from the muteness of other animals, since the former—but not the latter—involves the suspension or interruption of a faculty that had until then been enjoyed (Heidegger’s remarks in Being and Time on reticence are relevant here: only a being that can talk is able to keep quiet). There is, in other words, a loss, the realization of a negative possibility that does not pertain to other animals. So while there may be some linkage between the feeling of anxiety and the ways that animals can be afflicted with fear, panic, and terror, lacking in the animal is the possibility of the kind of cognitive uptake of these states that allows any existential and metaphysical significance to be wrung from them.

The final chapter of the book is devoted to Emmanuel Levinas. To this extent, he gets the last word in Bergo’s narrative, although I think Bergo would be the first to point out that there is no last word when it comes to a phenomenon as polymorphous as anxiety. Still, Levinas’s contributions are “decisive” insofar as “he brought ‘body’ and ‘mind,’ ‘self’ and ‘other’ to their closest interconnection, through his analysis of intersubjectivity” (398). Working against the backdrop of both Husserl’s and Heidegger’s phenomenology, Levinas reworks their ideas through his preoccupation with the other as the principal occasion for anxiety. Whereas for Heidegger, anxiety served to focus Dasein’s self-concern—its own being-possible, including the all-important possibility of impossibility (death)—for Levinas, anxiety attests to our intersubjectivity: “Anxiety functions in Levinas’s philosophy above all as the sign, or lived sense, of carrying another person in me” (469).

The short epilogue to the book briefly considers the practical significance of Bergo’s narrative. Here she ventures a “Stoic hypothesis,” to the effect “that knowledge, including philosophical knowledge, may palliate anxiety” (470). There is, of course, an issue regarding these practical ambitions of just what is being palliated how: if Bergo is right about the polymorphous character of anxiety, then there just is not any one thing whose edge might be tempered through philosophical reflection (and given the existential and metaphysical significance some of her historical figures accord to anxiety, viz., Kierkegaard and Heidegger, one might wonder whether the edge ought to be taken off at all). But if what is at issue is soothing a form of anxiety marked by “descent into panic,” “ego-loss,” and “community destruction” (478), I should mention one further simplification. Bergo leaves unexplored what she refers to dismissively in the Introduction as “the burgeoning, popular[1] psychological literature,” wherein anxiety appears as a medicatable disorder” (3). In Bergo’s defense, it can be noted that we are currently awash in all manner of pharmaceuticals, and yet we seem to be more anxious (and depressed) than ever. Then again philosophy has, by Bergo’s reckoning, been conceiving and reconceiving our modern, anxious predicament since the advent of the 19th century, and yet here we are. One wonders then where more promise lies: with a return to the central texts in the recent history of philosophy that Bergo begins to explore here or with further advances in more biologically-based approaches to our afflictions. Perhaps even a second cocktail before dinner would be equally effective. For my part, if the choice is between poring over more Schelling or pouring some Green Chartreuse (finely crafted by Carthusian monks, who surely know a thing or two about alleviating our worldly cares), then I’ll be reaching for the bottle.    


Thanks to Maria Balaska for comments on a previous draft.


Cerbone, David R. 2000. “Heidegger and Dasein’s ‘Bodily Nature’: What is the Hidden Problematic?” International Journal of Philosophical Studies 8: 209–230.

Cerbone, David R. 2013. “Heidegger and Spatiality,” in The Cambridge Companion to Being and Time. M. Wrathall (ed.). Cambridge University Press.


[1] One wonders, though, why anxiety’s so appearing is confined here to popular psychological literature. Surely, there is more serious work being done under this heading across psychology, psychiatry, neurology, and psychopharmacology.