Aping Mankind: Neuromania, Darwinitis and the Misrepresentation of Humanity

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Raymond Tallis, Aping Mankind: Neuromania, Darwinitis and the Misrepresentation of Humanity, Acumen, 2011, 388pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781844652723.

Reviewed by Justin Garson, Hunter College of The City University of New York


Raymond Tallis's Aping Mankind is an ambitious book. One part is a methodological critique of pop-neuroscience and pop-darwinism; another is a metaphysical journey designed to separate consciousness from the brain and rescue libertarian free will, humanism, and moral progress from a variety of 'pernicious' reductionisms. In some ways, Tallis is the perfect author for such a book: he is a retired clinical neurophysician who has authored over a dozen philosophical books on human nature and holds adventurous theories about the evolution of human consciousness.

At best, the book is a welcome supplement to the growing philosophical literature that aims to debunk the kind of facile scientific claims that make newspaper headlines, such as the discovery of a 'gene for' empathy, a 'brain region for' taking out sub-prime mortgages, or experiments that 'prove' hard determinism or the universal selfishness of humanity. At worst, it can read like an overly long response to Dennett's Consciousness Explained, one that employs the kinds of arguments that make professional philosophers smile condescendingly. The book as a whole is divided into nine chapters. Although I will refrain as much as possible from evaluation in the chapter overview, I will make some scattered evaluative comments before summarizing the main strengths and weaknesses of the book as a whole.

In Chapter One, Tallis surveys the various theories he opposes: roughly, those that place the brain or evolution at center stage for explaining human cognition and behavior. 'Neuromania' is the view that "we are our brains" (29). 'Darwinitis' is the view that there is no 'deep' or 'essential' difference between humans and non-human animals (147). These views have epistemological counterparts: that the brain, or evolution, can explain "every aspect of human life" (5). Chapter Two enumerates what he takes to be the devastating consequences of these doctrines: loss of belief in free will and the reality of the self, the death of the humanities, and the loss of faith in moral or social progress. The most charitable way to read these first two chapters is to assume that Tallis's purpose is to survey a number of loosely-related ideas that are symptomatic of anti-humanist sentiments.

Chapter Three is the longest in the book, at just over 70 pages. The first ten pages summarize the pitfalls of fMRI scans; though there is little novel here, it is useful nonetheless. The remaining pages attack the underlying metaphysical thesis of neuromania, which is that mental states are in some sense identical to brain states ('neuromania' appears to cover both classic type-type identity views such as those associated with U. T. Place and J. J. C. Smart, as well as token-token identity theories associated with functionalism). He argues against this identification by using well-known arguments involving qualia, intentionality, privacy, the 'binding problem,' the Chinese Room argument, and the explanatory gap. This chapter illustrates the best and the worst of Tallis' book, as will be elaborated below.

Chapter Four attacks darwinitis by emphasizing the vast difference between humans and animals: "we take the biological givens and subordinate them to distinctively human ends" (155). (Of course, to say that humans "subordinate the biological givens to human ends" borders on tautology, but the distinct nature of these ends will be discussed below.) He provides a deflationary critique of the significance of tool use in animals such as chimpanzees or octopuses (158-9). He also argues that evolution cannot explain consciousness because it cannot explain why conscious deliberation would be more advantageous than an army of well-designed unconscious modules (175-181). However, this argument seems to commit him to the claim that if we can conceive of a mechanism that would have been more advantageous than an existing one, then evolution cannot explain the latter -- this would be an example of hyper-adaptationism at its worst.

Chapter Five diagnoses the apparent plausibility of neuromania and darwinitis. It stems from confusing metaphor and literal speech. I will discuss this interesting accusation in more detail below. The chapter contains a thorough critique of the exaggerated claims that some scientists have made about so-called 'mirror neurons,' (190) though similar critiques are available (e.g., Patricia Churchland's recent Braintrust).

Chapter Six is the most speculative of the book. It attempts to account for the wide gulf between humans and non-human animals. The central player in this story is the opposable thumb, along with the upright posture and pointing finger. The opposable thumb gives humans a dexterity that other animals don't have. It leads us to comprehend the concept of choice: we can grasp a potentially large number of objects from which we have to select. It gives us the concept of a tool, a concept which not only fuels the rapid development of tool use in humans but also a conception of our body as an instrument, and of our agency. This, in conjunction with an upright posture, places us at a 'distance' from the world around us, and enhances our awareness of self as distinct from environment. The pointing finger opens a public space and makes us more aware of the social world. Thus, only humans possess true society, not spatial aggregations, propositional attitudes that result in true emotions, not 'physiological emotions,' and an awareness of norms and possibilities, not mere knowledge of 'objects and forces.' This leads him to the denouement of the book: If one is seeking the origin of human distinctiveness, the brain is the wrong place to look. Our distinctiveness stems from a shared space of meaning opened by the thumb, posture, pointing, and language.

Chapter Seven makes the case for libertarian freedom. He criticizes the significance of Libet's famous results for free will by arguing that freedom should be judged by the way an action is embedded in a far-reaching project rather than an isolated motor movement. This is not a novel point but a valuable one. His boldest claim is that, because humans are able to 'harness' the laws of nature to serve their purposes, they are not themselves 'bound' by those laws. As he puts the point, "we are able to step back into the great extra-natural space that is the human world . . . and from there use material causes as handles on the material world" (259). In my view, whatever validity this argument may seem to possess stems merely from a tension between metaphors used to describe the relation between humans and nature. A natural law is pictured as something like a rope: one tied up by a rope cannot use that rope to tie others.

Chapter Eight turns to the theme of 'defending the humanities' by attacking the impure marriages between traditional disciplines and neuroscience, such as neuro-aesthetics, neuro-economics, neuro-law, neuro-ethics, and neuro-theology. Chapter Nine tentatively explores the prospects for a non-'materialist' yet non-'dualist' theory of mind. One is the extended mind theory associated with Andy Clark, another is a radically different conception of matter informed by quantum mechanics, and a third is panpsychism. The first is friendly to his aim because it retains physicalism without reducing the mind to the brain and is consistent with the special role of human communities and the 'technosphere' in facilitating self-awareness. However, its flaw is that it is wedded to the metaphor of 'information' and cedes too great of a role to the brain (352).

In my estimation, Tallis is at his strongest when engaged in methodological critiques of popular neuroscience, such as the way the presentation of fMRI scans can mislead one into facile localizationism and the exaggerated claims made about the role of mirror neurons in empathy, brain scans in criminal responsibility, the temporal lobe in spirituality, and so on. If Tallis were to write a short book collecting these vignettes, I would be inclined to make it required reading for a philosophy of biology course. Moreover, his willingness to engage philosophers, social theorists, and scientists on these fundamental philosophical issues is valuable and should be applauded. Too few scientists, in my view, tackle the philosophical, ethical, and social implications of their work.

However, I don't think the book exhibits the kind of philosophical sophistication that will win an audience amongst philosophers, despite Tallis’s insistence that the reason philosophers don't read his work is that philosophy has been hijacked by "hard-line philosophical materialists" (342) and those who "grovel before the supposed superiority of science" (346). In particular, there are two major problems that run through the book (amongst others).

The first is his apparent assumption that, if a given neurological capacity does not provide a complete explanation for a given mental capacity, it is no explanation at all. This leads him to conclude, in some cases, that neuroscience has 'nothing to do' with a certain cognitive capacity when it obviously does. For example, he claims that the Aplysia model of memory can't account for the richness of memory in human systems, and therefore "neuroscience . . . cannot claim to have an account of memory" (127). But this is because human memories are integrated into a network of emotion and cognition that Aplysia doesn't have. Just because the Aplysia system cannot explain the niceties of human memory doesn't mean that it is not a crucial ingredient in any such explanation. By the same token, recent work in neuro-economics suggests a neurological basis for racking up credit card debt: paying by credit card is associated with reduction of activation in the insula associated with negative emotions (324). Tallis points out that this research doesn't exhaust the subtleties of human economic behavior, but his conclusion, that neuro-economics is "groundless," seems exaggerated (326). Similarly, he notes that the loose association between spiritual experience and enhanced temporal lobe activity explains neither the institution of religion nor the diversity of spiritual practices. Yet he certainly takes this assessment too far in concluding that "brain scans add nothing to our understanding of religion" (329).

A second problematic inference that runs throughout the book is that, in order for a neural structure to represent a property, it must possess that property. For example, he claims that nothing in my brain turns yellow while I perceive a yellow object; thus, the perception isn't in my brain (85). Of course, the charge is usually rebuffed by noting that the ability to represent a property does not logically require possession of that property. Logically, the fact that my brain can represent something as being square-shaped or oblong or rough or smooth does not imply that it must be square-shaped or oblong or rough or smooth.

Yet this error is pervasive and sullies his lengthy discussion of the 'binding problem' (114-120). The problem is often stated in something like the following terms: we perceive our environments as integrated wholes, rather than a puree of colors, shapes, sounds, and so on. But these different elements are processed in different neural subsystems. Where in the brain do they 'come together' to yield the integrated percept? As has been pointed out by many philosophers, there is no logical reason to hold that an integrated percept requires anatomical 'integration,' for the same reason that perceiving the color green does not logically require something in the brain to turn green (O'Regan and Noe 2001, 967). The brain can represent a scene as integrated without itself displaying that integration. A similar problem affects Tallis’s critiques of the neurobiology of anticipation and religion.

Tallis has a rejoinder to this latter criticism, one that gets to the heart of his view of what makes humans distinct from the natural world. In his view, the brain cannot literally 'represent something as being a certain way,' because brains do not intrinsically possess intentionality (105), nor do parcels of matter more generally (359). A neuron is not literally 'about' anything. Yet Tallis makes little attempt to engage with the sprawling philosophical industry devoted to naturalistic approaches to intentionality. The entire field of teleosemantics, which in my view is the most promising avenue for understanding intentionality, is dismissed in a footnote as merely one more expression of the 'darwinitis' he feels has been adequately rebuffed (233).

One of Tallis’s main arguments against the ascription of intentionality to matter is that biological 'information' (and associated concepts with an intentional flavor such as 'computing,' 'signaling,' and so on) is a reified metaphor and therefore cannot serve as a platform for naturalizing intentionality. However, this claim is bolstered by a questionable reconstruction of the recent history of neuroscience. In his assessment, 'information' entered the neurosciences in the early 1950s through the explicit appropriation of Shannon's quantitative measure (so called 'information-theoretic' information). It was understood at the time (by scientists such as MacKay and McCulloch) that the measure does not correspond to our common-sense notion of 'meaning' (so-called 'semantic information'). Cognitive scientists, in his view, missed this crucial point, as they confuse information-theoretic information with semantic information and by virtue of that confusion believe it unproblematic that nerve signals carry information 'about' the world.

Historically speaking, however, the idea that nerve signals carry information about the natural world has a more extensive pedigree. Mid-eighteenth century German physiologists Helmholtz and du Bois Reymond compared the nervous system to the telegraph (e.g., Lenoir 1994) and referred to the impulses it carries as 'nachricht' ('news'). In the 1920s, neurophysiologists such as Edgar Adrian embedded the study of single neurons in the language of 'information,' 'communication,' 'signaling,' and so forth (Garson 2003). The appropriation of information-theoretic information into neuroscience in the 1950s was not responsible for generating the idea that neurons carry meaningful messages; if anything, the plausibility of Shannon's measure depended on the prior assumption that neural firings can 'represent' the world. Moreover, scientists and philosophers have hotly debated the question of whether biological 'information' is anything more than a metaphor (see, e.g., Maynard-Smith 2000 and other articles in the same issue of Philosophy of Science); it cannot be summarily dismissed as unconscious semantic slippage.

I sympathize with the kind of frustration that Tallis expresses, as other philosophically-minded neuroscientists have shared the same concern: how can we give the brain due credit in explaining the mind without accepting various 'pernicious' forms of reductionism? Neuroscientists such as Paul Weiss, Roger Sperry, and John Eccles all struggled with the same question, and the concerns they raised left a mark on philosophy of mind in the 1970s and 1980s in the guise of emergentism and 'downwards causation' (Garson 2006). Despite their flaws, the value of these works rested partly in the way they expressed a certain zeitgeist and partly in the way that they prompted naturalists not to trivialize the true weight of their philosophical mission. Perhaps Tallis' book can be appreciated in the same way.



Garson, J. 2003. The Introduction of Information into Neurobiology. Philosophy of Science 70: 926-936.

Garson, J. 2006. Emergentism. In Sarkar, S., and Pfeiffer, J. (Eds.), The Philosophy of Science: An Encyclopedia (New York: Routledge).

Lenoir, T. 1994. Helmholtz and the Materialities of Communication. Osiris 9:185-207.

Maynard-Smith, J. 2000. The Concept of Information in Biology. Philosophy of Science 67: 177-194.

O'Regan, J. K., and Noe, A. 2001. A Sensorimotor Account of Vision and Visual Consciousness. Behavioral and Brain Sciences 24: 939-1031.