Apt Imaginings: Feelings for Fictions and Other Creatures of the Mind

Apt Imaginings

Jonathan Gilmore, Apt Imaginings: Feelings for Fictions and Other Creatures of the Mind, Oxford University Press, 2020, 258pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190096342.

Reviewed by Moonyoung Song, National University of Singapore


Jonathan Gilmore’s book makes important contributions to a range of debates related to imaginings, especially imaginings in the context of engaging with fiction and artwork. The main question this book pursues is whether the norms that govern the aptness of our engagements with fiction are continuous or discontinuous with those governing the aptness of our engagements with the real world. Gilmore argues for discontinuity, in the case of both affective norms about emotional responses toward real versus fictional objects and epistemic norms about believing what is true in the real world versus imagining what is true in a fiction. This book also discusses other topics in the neighborhood, including whether it is rational to have inconsistent desires regarding tragedy (e.g., desiring that Desdemona does not die in Othello and that a performance of Othello includes her death), why we often have positive evaluative attitudes toward fictional characters and events that we would deplore in real life, and what functions, if any, artworks have (the topic of artistic functions is not directly related to imaginings but plays a role in Gilmore’s argument for discontinuity).

Before discussing each of these topics, let me first mention two important virtues of this book. First, as will become clear below, the questions this book pursues are different from those all-too-familiar questions about imaginings, such as the paradox of fiction. This book instead sheds light on other, possibly more important, questions about imaginings that have not received the level of attention they deserve. Second, this book incorporates a wide range of empirical findings regarding imaginings and emotions, and Gilmore’s discussion of their philosophical significance is careful and thorough. As such, this book is an invaluable resource for those interested in an empirically informed philosophy about imaginings.  

I now turn to each of the topics in this rich book. The first topic is the continuity versus discontinuity debate. After introducing the book in Chapter 1 and surveying theories of imagination and emotions in Chapters 2 and 3, Gilmore spends three chapters arguing for discontinuity across fictional and real domains. Chapters 4 and 5 argue for discontinuity in affective norms, and Chapter 6 argues for discontinuity in epistemic norms.

It is worth emphasizing that Gilmore argues only for normative discontinuity. He accepts that fictional and real domains are descriptively continuous, at least in some respects. For instance, our engagements with the real world and imaginings share similar psychological mechanisms. Hence, the continuity versus discontinuity debate that Gilmore is concerned with differs from the familiar debate as to whether fiction-directed and reality-directed emotions are of the same kind. He accepts that they may be of the same kind, while arguing that they are still governed by different norms. This distinction between descriptive and normative (dis)continuity has heretofore not been clearly made in the literature, and it is one of the many valuable contributions of this book.

Gilmore’s argument for normative discontinuity, simply put, is that different kinds of considerations justify fiction-directed and reality-directed emotions (in the case of affective normativity) as well as believing and make-believing (in the case of epistemic normativity). More specifically, in the case of affective normativity, Gilmore argues that while an emotion directed toward a real object can be justified only by considerations that speak to the object’s having the property associated with the emotion type, which is called the emotion’s criterial quality (e.g., being a threat in the case of fear), “in the fictional case, there are also reasons that can justify the aptness of an emotion which do not speak to the object’s possession of the emotion’s criterial qualities” (114). Gilmore’s examples of such reasons include a film’s menacing soundtrack generating fear and the beauty of an elegy eliciting sadness for its subject. He argues that these considerations justify those emotions because, “if a fictional work of art or exercise of the imagination is designed to evoke an emotion toward some object it represents, and succeeds in doing so by virtue of that design, that is a reason counting in favor of the emotion’s aptness” (115). This is where artistic functions are relevant to Gilmore’s argument for discontinuity: When evoking a certain emotion is a function of an artwork and the work realizes the function, this contributes to the justification of the emotion.

Gilmore offers a similar argument for the discontinuity of epistemic norms. He argues that “a fiction can provide an experience that justifies imagining something to be true in the fiction while an analogous experience of the actual world would not justify an analogous belief” (144). For example, the character Fagin in Oliver Twist is physically grotesque, which elicits physical disgust from the reader. According to Gilmore, this justifies imagining him as morally corrupt, as physical disgust can be “a reliable indicator” of moral corruption in the fictional domain (145). In contrast, physical disgust would not justify an analogous belief in reality because, in reality, physical disgust is not a reliable indicator of moral corruption.

I elsewhere critically discussed an earlier version of Gilmore’s argument for affective discontinuity (Song 2020; Gilmore 2011). Here, I would like to raise a couple of questions about his arguments for affective and epistemic discontinuity that partly overlap with my earlier discussion.

First, there seems to be an asymmetry between Gilmore’s arguments for affective and epistemic discontinuity, which raises the question of where this asymmetry comes from. His argument for affective discontinuity is based on the claim that a consideration that does not speak to the object having the relevant property may justify a fiction-directed, but not a reality-directed emotion. As for epistemic normativity, however, Gilmore locates discontinuity elsewhere—a consideration that is a reliable indicator of something in the fictional domain and thus does speak to the relevant fictional truth in this sense may not be a reliable indicator of the same thing and thus may not speak to the relevant truth in the real world. In the epistemic case, he does not deny that a consideration needs to speak to the relevant fictional truth to justify make-believing. The epistemic discontinuity is just that the same consideration may speak to a fictional truth without speaking to an analogous truth. This asymmetry between Gilmore’s arguments for affective and epistemic discontinuity might reflect some important differences between affective and epistemic normativity, although it is also possible that the seeming asymmetry is due to my imperfect understanding of Gilmore’s arguments. Indeed, in some places he seems to offer a different argument for affective discontinuity that is parallel to his argument for epistemic discontinuity (see, for example, p126). In such places, he argues that a consideration that would not affect truth in reality may affect fictional truth.

Another question I would like to raise about Gilmore’s arguments for discontinuity concerns how he frames the debate as one between the continuity thesis (the thesis that the norms are continuous across fictional and real domains) and the discontinuity thesis (the thesis that the norms are discontinuous). Although the distinction between these two theses may seem clear, the debate is in fact not that simple. This is because, as Gilmore seems to acknowledge, even the proponents of continuity would accept that the norms governing fictional and real domains are discontinuous to some extent, as fictional objects do not exist in the way real objects do. Accordingly, what matters for affective or epistemic normativity in the case of fictional objects are the properties that they possess in the fiction, not those they possess in the real world. A fictional monster, for example, can never be a threat to us, although it can be a threat in the fiction. In other words, fictional truths play the role of truths when it comes to normativity in the fictional domain. The existence of this discontinuity is undeniable, unless one is willing to accept that the same, truth-based norms govern both fictions and real life, in which case fiction-directed emotions and make-believing as a class would become inapt.

A question then arises: How many discontinuities, or what kinds of discontinuities, would count as sufficient to establish the discontinuity thesis? The answer cannot be as simple as “any discontinuities beyond the undeniable discontinuity between truths and fictional truths,” because this discontinuity comes with other discontinuities, such as fictional truths and truths being determined by or connected with different kinds of considerations. Does such a discontinuity establish the discontinuity thesis, even though it almost follows from the undeniable discontinuity? This question is important as Gilmore’s arguments, at least the one for epistemic discontinuity, appeal to such discontinuities.

My own view is that there is no correct answer to that question; therefore, instead of asking whether the norms governing fictional and real domains are discontinuous, we should ask in exactly which ways the norms are continuous and discontinuous. Gilmore’s arguments for the discontinuity thesis are, of course, insightful as an answer to this question as well.

Chapter 7 concerns desires, and the question Gilmore focuses on is whether it is rational to have inconsistent desires regarding tragedy. We often desire that a tragic event does not happen in a fiction (e.g., we desire that Desdemona does not die in Othello) while at the same time desiring that the work contains that event (e.g., we want a performance of Othello to contain Desdemona’s death). Gilmore argues that, while there is a genuine conflict between the two desires, having those desires simultaneously is not irrational. This is because, according to him, having both desires is necessary for the satisfaction of a third, higher-order desire—namely, the desire for the goods that can be gained by engaging with a tragedy while having those desires. Those goods include, but are not limited to, certain kinds of pleasure, the clarification of our emotions, enlightenment about the nature of suffering, and contemplation about our own vulnerability to loss.

The topic of Chapter 8 is deviant evaluative attitudes toward fictional characters and events that we would not have if the objects were real. It is not uncommon for audiences to have positive attitudes, such as the feeling of an affiliation, toward vicious characters like Tony Soprano and Humbert Humbert while engaging with fictions. Gilmore argues that this phenomenon results from breaches in the quarantine while audiences simulate such characters’ mental states. Although what is being simulated is usually kept in quarantine from the simulator’s own mental states, this barrier sometimes breaks down, resulting in the simulator genuinely adopting some of the mental states of the person they simulate. According to Gilmore, this is what happens when audiences have positive attitudes toward vicious fictional characters.

In order for this account to fully explain the phenomenon of deviant evaluative attitudes toward fictional characters, an explanation is needed as to why such breakdowns during simulation occur exclusively or at least much more frequently when we simulate fictional characters compared to analogous real people. Gilmore does not discuss this question in depth, but he suggests a few possibilities, including fictions often providing an internal perspective on a character’s mind and the pleasure coming from the aesthetic representation of a character being misattributed to the character. Note, however, that these conditions can be met in a non-fiction case (e.g., a documentary about a pedophile). And I doubt that we would have equally positive attitudes in such a case. The difference between a real person and a fictional character seems to matter somehow. If this is correct, Gilmore’s account falls short of being the whole story, although it certainly explains an important part of the phenomenon.

The topic of Chapter 9, artistic functions, is not about imaginings, but it is relevant to Gilmore’s argument for discontinuity, as we saw earlier. Here, Gilmore’s main claim is that, while artworks do have functions, there is no set of functions that all artworks share qua art. Instead, Gilmore argues that different artworks may have different artistic functions, as an artwork’s artistic functions are just its constitutive functions, which he understands as the functions essential to the work’s identity. Gilmore then uses this account of artistic functions to argue for an interaction between moral and artistic value. According to him, an artwork’s moral defect is an artistic defect if the work has a constitutive moral function, and the work’s moral defect interferes with the satisfaction of this function. This argument has an interesting implication: In the case of a thoroughly immoral artwork that has no moral aim, its moral defect is not necessarily an artistic defect, whereas a moral defect is an artistic defect if the work has a moral aim but fails to achieve it due to the moral defect.

I do not have enough space to give this argument the justice it deserves, but it is worth mentioning that its plausibility crucially relies on the plausibility of Gilmore’s account of artistic functions. If, contrary to the account, a constitutive function may not be an artistic function, Gilmore’s argument about value interaction would merely show that a work’s moral defect can interfere with realizing its moral function, which is uncontroversial. Is, then, a work’s constitutive function, which Gilmore characterizes as a function essential to the work’s identity, always an artistic function? The answer seems to depend on what kind of identity is at issue. If it is identity qua artwork, a constitutive function is plausibly always an artistic function, but those who oppose interaction between moral and artistic value would disagree with Gilmore that a work’s moral function can be essential to its identity qua artwork. On the other hand, if the kind of identity at issue is an ordinary, non-art kind, then it is unclear whether all constitutive functions are artistic functions. Either way, Gilmore’s argument for value interaction, in its current form, seems to require further support.

This book is essential reading for those interested in philosophical issues about imaginings. With its novel approaches and original arguments, the book will inspire philosophers working on imaginings for a long time to come. It is also written with clarity and is full of engaging real-world art examples, which should make the book accessible and enjoyable even to those readers not already familiar with the relevant literature.


Song, Moonyoung. "Aptness of fiction-directed emotions." The British Journal of Aesthetics 60 (2020): 45–59.

Gilmore, Jonathan. "Aptness of emotions for fictions and imaginings." Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 92 (2011): 468–489.