Aquinas on Being, Goodness, and God

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Christopher Hughes, Aquinas on Being, Goodness, and God, Routledge, 2015, 370pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415346443.

Reviewed by Adam Wood, Wheaton College


"This book is full of arguments," says Christopher Hughes, a few lines into his preface. And so it is. Many of the arguments are either Aquinas's own or Hughes's reconstructions of how Thomas's arguments might have gone. Far more numerous, however, are Hughes's own arguments against the plausibility of Aquinas's views or the cogency of his reasoning on their behalf. Indeed, so persistent is Hughes in critically evaluating features of Aquinas's thought that his work reminded me, more than anything, of another book full of arguments: William de la Mare's Correctorium fratris Thomae. In this late-1270s work, the English Franciscan sets about explaining why over one hundred propositions from Aquinas's Sentences commentary, disputed and quodlibetal questions, and Summa theologiae are contrary to the faith, contrary to the Philosopher's teachings, or just plain wrong. De la Mare's aim was pretty clearly to undermine the authority of a rival order's most prominent scholar as well as to scotch some philosophical positions he thought pernicious. Hughes's goal is less obvious. Every one of the seventeen essays the volume comprises appears to have as its central aim undermining some central Thomistic thesis or bit of reasoning. And while the book's back cover mentions Aquinas's importance in the history of philosophy, the comprehensiveness and flexibility of his metaphysical framework, and the striking originality of his views, its pages contain (as far as I could tell) no such praise. Yet it is hard to see why someone wholeheartedly critical of Aquinas's program, without some ulterior motive like de la Mare's, would devote nearly 400 pages of detailed argumentation to setting the Thomas straight.

Adding to my perplexity was the fact that Hughes dispenses almost entirely with attempts to position Aquinas's views or arguments within the context of his own thought or the history of philosophy and refers only briefly to a few snippets from the vast secondary literature on Thomas's thought. Many contemporary commentators on Aquinas are frequently critical of his views and arguments. Robert Pasnau and Peter King jump to mind. Yet Pasnau and King temper their criticism with admiration for this or that contribution on Aquinas's part. They are interested in ferreting out the ideological motivations underlying Aquinas's thought and tracing out its influence (for better or worse) on subsequent thinkers. They are also interested in filling in gaps in our understanding of Aquinas's views that other interpreters have ignored or have misunderstood. To my mind, these are all essential components of what it means to do sound scholarship in the history of philosophy. No doubt there is an important place for analyzing views and arguments and indeed for critical analysis. But that this volume comprises nothing but critical argumentative analysis, together with a few other features that I'll mention below, makes it a rather idiosyncratic work. Still, Hughes's book should prove helpful to scholars of Aquinas in at least one respect, which I'll explain after an overview of its contents.

As I mentioned, there are seventeen essays collected together here. Eighteen, if you count the first chapter -- a brief introduction to Aquinas's life and works (but this seems to have been a late addition, since several times Hughes's text refers to chapter two, on metaphysics, as chapter one). At any rate, the essays are fairly discrete compositions. On rare occasions Hughes will reference something discussed previously, but each essay could easily enough be read on its own. I didn't discern any overarching aim or argument towards which the work as a whole was building. The essays are clustered around four subjects: metaphysics, human nature, natural theology and meta-ethics/action theory. Of these, the metaphysics section is the widest ranging, comprising seven essays.

The first of these discusses Aquinas's "taxonomy of being." Instead of relying on any of the divisions of being Thomas himself proposes, Hughes invents his own, starting with a partition between complete and incomplete being and then subdividing these categories further based on whether they are received or unreceived. The main feature of this first essay, however, is a critical look at Aquinas's notion that "being" functions as an analogous term. Hughes doesn't consider the background to this claim, Aristotelian or otherwise, but tries to show that it has counterintuitive consequences that render it problematic. In response to the suggestion that "what Aquinas means by ens is not what we mean by being," such that Thomas's views might not be that counterintuitive after all, Hughes says this is "a rather desperate move" (20). This illustrates one of his favorite strategies: insisting that Aquinas's thinking about X, Y or Z must line up with what "folk metaphysics" would say about such matters and criticizing him if it does not. In the third metaphysics essay, for instance, he attacks what he calls "Thomistic tropism," the view that forms, like the whiteness of this sheet of paper or Socrates's humanity, are unshareable particulars rather than shareable entities, à la David Armstrong's universals. He thinks the folk would reject the idea that Socrates's humanity is a distinct item from Plato's or that there are multiple whitenesses where there are multiple distinct white objects. Perhaps he's right about this. In that case, if the folk are our guide, Aquinas may subscribe to an objectionable sort of tropism, although since I think most other medieval Aristotelians joined him in doing so, along with many contemporary nominalists, I'm not sure it's especially "Thomistic."

The second metaphysics essay positions Aquinas on the problem of material constitution as a sort of constitutional dualist, albeit (Hughes argues) of a pretty unattractive sort. Noteworthy here is Hughes's introduction of "subject of generation and corruption matter" or "sgc-matter," which is his name for "the matter that is the persisting subject of a substantial change." I would have thought that "prime matter" or "matter from which" (materia ex qua) would be the right Thomistic names for the stuff under discussion here, but Hughes tends to prefer neologisms and acronyms. I never got quite clear on how sgc-matter fit in alongside the various sorts of matter Aquinas himself discusses. Both here, however, and in the fourth metaphysics essay (which continued with themes developed in this one), Hughes is keen on criticizing Aquinas's position that sgc-matter could only be determined by one substantial form at a time and hence that substances themselves cannot be composed of smaller substances with their own substantial forms (at least not straightforwardly; Hughes does note Aquinas's views on the virtual presence of elements in mixed bodies). In rejecting the unicity of substantial forms, interestingly, Hughes is in perfect agreement with de la Mare.

Nor is this the only time he sides with Thomas's Franciscan detractors against Aquinas himself. The fifth, sixth and seventh metaphysics essays all advocate positions characteristic of Aquinas's late-thirteenth century adversaries: immaterial substances cannot be identical to substantial forms (and hence cannot each constitute a unique species), matter cannot have anything to do with individuation, and the essence and existence of creatures cannot be really distinct from one another. While each of these positions would have been familiar to de la Mare, the reasoning by which Hughes reaches them would not have been. He resolutely insists on thinking through Aquinas's views on his own (or in consultation with the folk) instead of consulting other interpreters, whether medieval or recent.

The human nature section of the book includes four essays but is fairly brief. Hughes claims first that because Aquinas argues (ineptly, he thinks) for the incorporeality of intellectual operations, he "has a profoundly dualistic conception of human beings" (125). He goes on to explain why Aquinas should have moved past his half-hearted "quasi-Cartesian" substance dualism, according to which human souls are not complete substances, to a more robust view on which human beings, their souls, and their bodies are all distinct substances. Indeed, it seems "un-immediately-obvious" to Hughes why we should think of human intellective souls as substantial forms at all. It looked to me, though, like he significantly misunderstood Aquinas's reasoning for this view in Summa theologiae (ST) 1a.76.1. He thinks Aquinas is trying to show that the human intellect is our sole substantial form, but Thomas actually rejects this view in ST 1a.77.1. Instead, Thomas is arguing that the human intellectual principle is our substantial form. He argues that it is our sole substantial form a few questions later, at ST 1a.76.4. Those interested should consult chapter five of Pasnau's Thomas Aquinas on Human Nature (Cambridge University Press, 2002) for an account of why these details matter. Hughes's section on human nature concludes by positioning Aquinas vis-a-vis contemporary debates between personalists and animalists. Hughes thinks Aquinas would reject personalism since he believes human souls can survive in a separated state without human persons surviving. I agree with this interpretation, for my part, but it would have been helpful to mention that whether Thomas is a "survivalist" or a "corruptionist" about human persons after their deaths has been vigorously disputed recently.

The third section, on natural theology, focuses on just three points. First, what Hughes calls Aquinas's "modal cosmological argument" for God's existence (the "third way" from the Summa theologiae or the argument of Summa contra gentiles 1.15) is an utter failure. There is no reason why there couldn't be an infinite causal regress, nor why contingent beings must always be caused. The second point in this section concerns Aquinas's account of divine simplicity. While Hughes thinks it uncontroversial to deny that God has proper parts, provided he exists, he considers the claims Aquinas makes about God's simplicity -- that God has no accidents, for instance, or that he is identical to his essence, existence and perfections -- extremely problematic. They cannot be reconciled with the folk's intuition that God "has" properties. They cannot be reconciled with God's making choices or changing his mind. They cannot be reconciled with any orthodox doctrine of the Trinity. In this section Hughes builds on ideas from his 1989 work On a Complex Theory of a Simple God: An Investigation in Aquinas's Philosophical Theology (Cornell University Press). Hughes's final point in the natural theology section is that since Aquinas is a "soft theological determinist" (244) he cannot appeal to free will to explain why there is evil in the world. As for the explanation Thomas does give for the existence of sin and suffering, which Hughes dubs the "for-the-best explanation," he considers it difficult to reconcile with the idea that God is love.

None of the three essays in the book's last section target theses that I took to be especially Thomistic. One concerns the closely related meta-ethical claims that being is convertible with goodness and that evil is a privation. Augustine memorably describes how he got these ideas from "some books of the Platonists" in book seven of the Confessions. Another discusses the "guise of the good" thesis -- that we always act in pursuit of a perceived good -- which is standard Aristotelian fare. Same with the last claim Hughes considers in this section: that we always act in pursuit of our own happiness. Some of the thought experiments Hughes forwards in this section are quite interesting. What if a genie offered to extend your life to any finite number of days, however large, with each day containing more satisfaction than the last? You'd know that for any finite number you picked, you could have picked a larger number, presumably making your life overall better. Does that show, contrary to the guise of the good thesis, that we sometimes make choices we know to be suboptimal? Possibly. I'm not sure. It did seem odd to me, though, to spend 42 pages discussing claims Aquinas makes about our acting in pursuit of a perceived good, or 46 on the convertibility of being and goodness, without any effort at setting these claims in their broader Aristotelian or Augustinian context.

That Hughes does very little to motivate or situate the claims he considers within the broader context of Aquinas's thought or the history of philosophy is just one reason why this book is poorly suited for students or scholars not already familiar with Thomas's thought. Another reason is that despite its length and the comprehensive scope its title suggests, its actual range is rather limited. The last two sections on God and goodness, for instance, though they occupy over two hundred pages, focus exclusively on just six points, some fairly narrow. A third reason is Hughes's forbidding writing style. As mentioned, many of the chapters are very long, with no section breaks or indication of their trajectory. Most launch straight into fast-paced, sustained argumentation. Untranslated Latin tags (e.g., ex vi terminorum, in communi accepta or toto caelo), definitions compressed into acronyms (e.g., QSDS for the "quasi-strong doctrine of divine simplicity"), complex concepts (e.g., "non-predicamentally-accidentally-informed necessary complete being" or "strongly contingent intrinsic properties") and neologisms (at one point Hughes remarks "what better place for Latin neologisms than a book on Aquinas?" [326], though there are plenty in English too) all proliferate. So as Hughes warns in his preface, this isn't beach reading.

While these factors taken together may make the book unsuitable as an introductory work, experts on Aquinas's thought may profit from it at least insofar as they will encounter a wealth of objections against various central Thomistic ideas. Those unmoved by appeals to folk metaphysics, or to Hughes's own intuitions, will find many of these objections unpersuasive. The frequency of phrases like "so it is not obvious to me why Aquinas should have held X" or "so I really can't understand what Aquinas means by Y" may also be off-putting if you find arguments from lack of obviousness or from gaps in understanding unpersuasive. But some bits of reasoning are impressively rigorous, and others (like the genie thought experiment) are fun to think through. Since the essays in the book are largely independent from one another, I expect that Aquinas scholars will find it profitable to dive in and consult what Hughes has to say on one of its seventeen topics. They'll find a consistently adversarial viewpoint, much as Richard Knapwell, John Quidort and other late 13th-century Dominicans found in de la Mare's Correctorium.