Aquinas on the Beginning and End of Human Life

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Fabrizio Amerini, Aquinas on the Beginning and End of Human Life, Mark Henninger (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2013, 260pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674072473.

Reviewed by Christina Van Dyke, Calvin College


The publication of this book created a bit of a stir -- one restricted largely to the world of medieval metaphysics and Thomistic studies, perhaps, but a stir nonetheless. The reason for this was two-fold. First, in this book, Fabrizio Amerini explicitly addresses Thomas Aquinas's embryology in the context of the Catholic Church's current teachings on abortion and the beginning of human life.[1] Second, Amerini avoids the easy answers in this polarized debate; his discussion is highly nuanced, exhaustively researched, and provides a sympathetic reading of both Aquinas's texts and contemporary Catholic teachings. Although I suspect the book will prove inaccessible to the non-specialist and fail to satisfy the specialist, Amerini should be commended for raising the bar in the debate. Any future discussion of Aquinas on this topic will need to address Amerini's treatment of the issue, and to take it seriously.

Aquinas's stance on the beginning of human life is a controversial topic -- especially in light of the modern abortion controversy and the corresponding importance many people attach to the question of when human life begins. Aquinas is a Doctor of the Catholic Church, but his position on this issue does not line up with the position of the contemporary church. Aquinas holds that human life starts only with the infusion of the rational soul into the fetal body around forty days after conception (a position called 'delayed hominization'), while the Catholic Church teaches that human life begins at conception (a position referred to as 'immediate hominization'). Scholarly discussions of this issue have tended to split into two camps. The first works to reconcile Aquinas's view with the official Catholic position, claiming that Aquinas's metaphysics should be read as compatible with immediate hominization, and/or that Aquinas himself would accept immediate hominization if he had access to current scientific information regarding fetal development. The second camp argues that Aquinas's metaphysics requires delayed hominization, and that attempts to bring his view in line with current Catholic teaching can be motivated neither by a careful examination of the relevant texts nor by appeal to Aquinas's own metaphysical or theological principles. To say that these two camps have at times come into conflict would be to put things mildly.

Amerini's treatment of this topic is intentionally a bit non-standard. He describes his methodology as "aporematic" -- a conscious attempt to "bring out the complexity of Thomas's thought . . . in a dialectical way, highlighting one aspect of his complex teaching before highlighting another that may or may not cohere with the former" (xxii). What this means in practical terms is that, instead of presenting and discussing relevant passages in the context of an explicit overall argument, the book moves back and forth within the topic, often drawing another set of distinctions or unearthing another guiding principle just as the reader expects a settlement of the question. Amerini expresses hope that his readers "will not be perplexed by this stylistic feature" but will be able to "follow patiently the thread through the 'argumentative labyrinth'" (xxii). He also stresses the modest scope of his study: it is not meant to offer answers to the pressing ethical questions in the debates surrounding abortion, but simply to offer "a philosophical reconstruction of Thomas Aquinas's teaching on embryology and an assessment of its possible bioethical implications" (xi).

The "argumentative labyrinth" in question -- which comes in at a relatively short 240 pages of text -- is divided into eight chapters. The first four chapters establish the book's general tone and pattern of discussion, and are meant to set the reader up for the extensive treatment of the identity of the embryo that occurs in the fifth chapter. The first chapter presents and discusses central principles guiding Aquinas's embryology, including his general views on the process of generation; the second chapter focuses on the rational soul's nature as the substantial form of the human being. The third chapter addresses Aquinas's accounts of the origin of the human soul and the 'ensoulment' of the embryo, and the fourth chapter focuses on three particular difficulties facing the account as laid out to that point.

The topics addressed in these first four chapters are precisely the ones that need addressing: everyone who works on this topic acknowledges that Aquinas's embryology (which involves first the existence of a being with only 'vegetative' powers, then the existence of a being with sensory as well as vegetative powers, and finally the generation of a human being via the infusion by God of a specially created rational soul) is complicated by his commitment to the unity of substantial form (the theory that each substance has one and only one substantial form, and that this form makes the substance what it is). The doctrine of the unity of substantial form entails that in the process of generation the vegetative being is a numerically distinct substance from the sensory being, which is in turn a numerically distinct substance from the human being. The questions this progression of substances raises for the diachronic identity of the embryo are vexed, to say the least, and Amerini does a good job laying out the difficulties involved.

The real heart of the book is chapter five, in which "The Identity of the Embryo" receives over sixty of the book's two hundred and forty pages. The linchpin of this chapter is Amerini's conclusion that, while the embryo cannot be numerically identical to the human being (because of changes on the level of both matter and form), there is nonetheless continuity of subject between embryo and human being. The key here is a thesis of generation Amerini identified early in the first chapter -- namely, that "natural generation is . . . brought to perfection only at the end of the process; hence, what is generated only exists at the end of the process of generation" (18). A human being only comes to existence, on this view, at the end of the process of generation. What exists prior to this point is, at most, something that is potentially a human being. This is a familiar claim that has been used to various ends in previous discussions. Amerini, however, imbues this claim with new significance. The fact that the embryo and the human being are the same subject (despite their lack of numerical identity), he believes, "can be derived from the fact that, metaphysically, the embryo is in potency to a human being so that a human being is what an embryo is in act[uality]" (163, added emphasis). This non-numerical identity of subject "presupposed by the unity between potency and act" (127) is what Amerini presents as the solution to the problem of the identity of the embryo.

It's clear that Amerini considers his discussion of identity to have done most of the heavy philosophical lifting for the book, for the final three chapters of the book together comprise only fifty pages, although they address "Bioethical Implications," "The Beginning and End of Human Life," and "The Contemporary Debate over the Hominization of the Embryo," respectively.

Amerini's conclusion regarding the bioethical consequences of Aquinas's position, ultimately, is that although "in the abstract" Aquinas's account is fully compatible "both with a position in favor of and against abortion," when it is looked at concretely, "Thomas's account provides certain philosophical reasons for taking up a position that is generally against abortion, even setting aside the question of when the hominization of the embryo takes place" (167-68). These reasons are, according to Amerini, precisely the special status that the pre-human embryo has in virtue of existing in potency to an actual human being. As a result, he dismisses the effort of some scholars to reconcile Aquinas's account of embryology with the present position of the Catholic Church on abortion as not just "philosophically and philologically unsatisfying" but also "largely pointless" (237). After tentatively suggesting a "gradual protection of human life" approach as the best reading of Aquinas's own view, Amerini discourages coming to any hard conclusion about the matter on the grounds that "as we have seen in this study no clear treatment of bioethical cases can be found within Thomas's metaphysical investigation of embryogenesis" (237-38).

I lack the space to address the specific issues I have with Amerini's exegesis of Aquinas and the philosophical conclusions drawn from that exegesis. On the general level it is worth noting, however, that one unfortunate result of the book's commitment to drawing out Aquinas's view from the texts without imposing any sort of external structure is that it involves rather more discussion of the role of menstrual blood and semen in the process of generation than one might expect, and rather less discussion of what a substance is -- or even what it might mean for the rational soul to be the substantial form of a human being. It is also left quite unclear what it might mean for the embryo and the human being to be one and the same subject without being numerically the same subject, or even exactly what it means for the embryo to be in potency to the human being. I believe this is intentional on Amerini's part, since he explicitly wants to avoid "reading views into" Aquinas. Still, his restraint is rather unhelpful. Medieval texts and terminology are notoriously inscrutable to the contemporary eye, and Amerini never steps far enough away from his subject matter to draw the modern reader in.[2]

Amerini is, nevertheless, meticulously even-handed in working his way through the relevant passages, and his command of the material is impressive. Mark Henninger also does an admirable job with the difficult task of translating Amerini's Italian into English while preserving his style and thought processes.[3] Scholars interested in Aquinas's account of embryology will find the book a valuable resource for both the primary and secondary literature on this topic.

The amount of effort necessary to work through the book's dialectical twists and turns, however, makes it unlikely to gain a broad readership -- and that, in the end, is perhaps not as tragic as it might be. Central discussions are frequently so convoluted that it is difficult to determine what, exactly, is being claimed . . . and it is sometimes unclear that the point made was significant enough to merit the effort. Take, for example, the following conclusion in the chapter on the bioethical implications of Aquinas's position:

This can be admitted: an embryo and a human being are not exactly the same entity, for they are not numerically the same entity. But that does not change the fact that for Thomas there is continuity between that embryo and that human being, and that this continuity could be taken as a sufficient metaphysical basis for developing a bioethical theory that is not ready to accept in a generalized way, or at least in an unregulated way, human intervention on embryos that relies on the distinction between a prehuman phase and a properly human phase of the embryos. (191)

It is as though someone has promised to tell you whether Rhett Butler comes back to Scarlett O'Hara after the end of Gone with the Wind, and then says that it doesn't seem to be the case that it is impossible that he would have failed to return. By the time one has finished parsing out exactly what has been said, one feels vaguely cheated at the lack of a definitive answer. Although a moderate voice is welcome in this often-contentious debate, this book has convinced me that moderation isn't always a virtue.

[1] Despite the title, the book really only treats Aquinas’s position on the beginning of human life. Aquinas’s stance on the end of human life receives less than ten of the two hundred and forty total pages, and those ten pages contain some of the most convoluted and philosophically problematic material of the book.

[2]  In this connection, many readers will find it especially frustrating that Amerini’s close and extensive paraphrases of Aquinas’s texts are footnoted with the relevant passages in the original Latin -- all of which are left untranslated. 

[3] The only real exception to this is chapter seven, which, unfortunately, also includes the only and extremely attenuated discussion of the end of human life.