Aquinas's Way to God: The Proof in De Ente et Essentia

Placeholder book cover

Gaven Kerr, OP, Aquinas's Way to God: The Proof in De Ente et Essentia, Oxford University Press, 2015, 205pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190224806.

Reviewed by Caleb Cohoe, Metropolitan State University of Denver


The famous five ways of the Summa Theologiae offer Thomas Aquinas's distillation of the most convincing arguments for God's existence. However, these arguments crucially rely on his metaphysical framework, which the ways themselves do not explicate or defend. Thus, in reading the five ways, we face an illusion of understanding. Those unfamiliar with Aquinas's medieval metaphysics often misinterpret his reasoning.

This is what makes De Ente et Essentia (De Ente) so useful. Gaven Kerr points out that De Ente presents the metaphysical principles on which Aquinas's philosophy rests in a concise but clear way. Aquinas's proof of God in the De Ente shows what is distinctive about his approach to God.

Kerr's book on the proof of God's existence in the De Ente will be helpful to anyone interested in understanding and evaluating either Aquinas's metaphysics or his specific case for a transcendent source of being. Kerr closely tracks each step of Aquinas's proof. Each chapter explicates and defends a key concept or claim in the argument. Kerr's approach is admirable. He examines the central philosophical issues without ever straying too far from the proof itself. While more defense of Aquinas's reasoning is needed at points, this book is an excellent companion to the De Ente. Kerr also relates Aquinas to positions in contemporary analytic philosophy of religion and metaphysics in a way that readers coming from these areas should find helpful. He does not, however, address questions of historical context and influence.

Kerr maintains that Aquinas presents proofs for the existence of God not primarily for polemical purposes but as part of "a concern for a scientific understanding of reality." (xvii) Aquinas is not issuing anxious apologetics but is rather trying to articulate the relation that created beings, from chemical elements to worshiping angels, have to their origin. Kerr maintains that the De Ente proof is more comprehensive than the five ways. It seeks to show that everything other than God, whether possible or actual, whether immaterial or material, depends on the divine being.

I will briefly outline Kerr's presentation of Aquinas's argument and then comment on how Kerr explicates and defends it. Aquinas starts by arguing that the essence of a thing is really distinct from its esse, its being or existence. Because of this, we need a further principle to explain why the thing actually exists. Since the existence of something cannot be accounted for internally by its essence, we need a suitable extrinsic principle that can make the essence actually exist. In other words, anything whose existence is really distinct from its essence depends on something else for its esse or existence. Such things need a cause of their being. But, Aquinas insists, what has esse from another ultimately depends on what has esse in itself, otherwise a vicious infinite regress would follow. There must, therefore, be something that is esse tantum, being itself, which is the primary cause of esse for everything else. This, Aquinas maintains, is what we understand God to be.

Chapter one discusses how Aquinas establishes a real distinction between what something is, its essence, and its esse or existence. Aquinas's argument starts by noting that we can understand what something is, e.g. a human or a phoenix, without knowing whether it really exists. But if esse or existence were part of the essence this would not be possible since we cannot properly understand an essence if we do not understand the parts of the essence (e.g. if rectilinear figure is part of the essence of triangle, we cannot understand triangle without understanding rectilinear figure). Kerr reads this stage of the argument as a conceptual one. How does this conceptual distinction assume metaphysical significance? Kerr follows John Wippel in thinking that you need to combine this stage with the next.

The next stage, on Kerr's reading, is a hypothetical one. Aquinas argues that if there were something in which esse and essence were not distinct, it could not be multiplied since none of the ways of multiplying something (by adding a difference, by being received in matter, by being participated in) could apply to it. Pure esse is indeterminable by anything extrinsic to it. On Kerr's and Wippel's reading, this claim, when combined with the previous stage, provides a modal argument for a real distinction. Every essence that is determinable or multipliable (as the essences of the things around us are) cannot be pure esse. Thus every other essence must be really distinct from its esse.

Although I think this two-stage interpretation is the best reading of this passage, their modal argument needs further defense. While the modal argument shows that there is some distinction between essence and esse in anything that is not pure esse, we also need to be convinced that this distinction is metaphysically fundamental. A number of thinkers after Aquinas, including Henry of Ghent and John Duns Scotus, develop notions of distinction (e.g. intentional distinction, formal distinction) on which the distinction between essence and esse is less robust. Further, some thinkers insist that real distinction requires the possibility of separate existence, a criterion that, for Aquinas, esse and essence do not meet. Thus the metaphysical significance of this distinction needs further defense.

After defending the real distinction, Kerr spends the next two chapters explicating Aquinas's key metaphysical principles of esse and essentia. In chapter two, he lays out Thomistic essentialism, on which objects have an intrinsic metaphysical structure that explains all the properties they possess. This structure can be understood and captured in a real definition. He contrasts this with the modalist essentialism of some contemporary analytic philosophers, which understands essences in terms of properties that hold true across all possible worlds. Kerr maintains that Thomistic essentialism is superior insofar as it gives a richer and more informative account of the nature of objects, avoids issues of transworld identity, and avoids Platonism about objects while still allowing for the essence to be understood or signified as a universal. On Kerr's reading, Thomas's essentialism is robust without being extravagant.

In chapter three, Kerr lays out Thomas's views on esse in contrast to the analytic views on existence of Frege and Russell, David Lewis, and other contemporary analytic philosophers. He makes clear why Aquinas insists that esse primarily belongs to things or substances and secondarily to properties or concepts that are or are not instantiated in contrast to the quantificational approach to existence of Frege-Russell-Quine. He also emphasizes the primary role of actuality for Thomas. Even for contemporary actualists, the actual is defined in relation to what is possible, whereas Aquinas thinks potentiality is only intelligible in relation to the power of something that is actual, so his order of explanation is different. This discussion should be helpful for those trying to situate Thomas's views in the context of contemporary metaphysics. However, contemporary specialists may find his discussions too cursory and dismissive.

In chapter four, Kerr examines the causal principle that Aquinas employs in the next phase of the argument: whatever belongs to a thing comes either from its intrinsic nature or from an external principle or cause. He explicates Thomistic causality in terms of ontological dependence; in particular, the dependence that the potential has on the actual. Kerr maintains that the Thomistic notion of causality is ultimately clearer and richer than reductive Humean or conceptualist accounts, with which he contrasts it. Here, however, as at other points where he discusses alternative philosophical worldviews, I was unclear about the terms of debate. I would have appreciated more explicit consideration of methodological issues (e.g. what starting points Kerr is using for evaluating metaphysical views).

After laying out Aquinas's causal principle, Kerr applies it to esse. He argues that existence, on Aquinas's framework, is not going to be brute since esse is related to essence as act to potency and is thus the sort of thing that requires a causal explanation. The real distinction between essence and esse means that the intrinsic principles of the object cannot provide a causal explanation, so we need an external causal principle of esse. Kerr concludes the chapter by showing that Aquinas's demand for causes is not entirely global: it applies only to objects whose essence is distinct from their being. Thus Aquinas's version of the causal principle does not give rise to the question of who caused God.

The external cause of esse will either be a composite of esse and essence in need of a further cause or pure esse. Chapter five examines why Aquinas denies the possibility of an infinite regress of causes. The De Esse does not explain this, so Kerr appropriately draws on other texts. He usefully distinguishes between accidentally ordered causal series, where each member depends only on the previous one, and essentially ordered causal series, where some primary cause is "cause of both the existence and the causality of the posterior causal relata." (148) In essentially ordered series, subsequent causes owe their status as causes to all the preceding members and thus, Kerr claims, must be finite in the sense that they proceed from some limit, a first cause that possesses causality of itself. However, in my view, Kerr's characterization of essentially ordered series does not prevent there being an infinite number of causes between the first and some later cause.

Kerr then argues that the external cause of esse will have to be part of an essentially ordered series. In accidentally ordered causal series, each member only depends on its cause for coming to be (e.g. the spider's offspring do not cease to be when the spider does). Since, however, we are looking for a cause of the ongoing being of things, not just their generation, the kind of cause we are looking for will be part of a continuing and simultaneous chain of dependence. Kerr moves too fast here. Perhaps things require a cause for the coming to be of their esse, but not for their continued being. Other features that are not part of the essence of something, such as a substance's accidents, only need an extrinsic cause for their coming to be. Esse may be different, but further explanation of why existence needs a continued and simultaneous cause is needed.

Kerr closes the chapter with a convincing response to Paul Edward's objection that a first cause of being could still be caused in some other respect. For the primary cause of esse to be caused in some way, it would need to be caused by something. But this cause would need to exist and thus would be one of those things that depend on the primary cause of esse, generating a circular dependence.

In chapter six, Kerr discusses the coherence of esse tantum. He argues that Anthony Kenny's problems with understanding Aquinas on esse come from trying to squeeze Aquinas into the Fregean framework of existence. While Kerr describes the esse commune that creatures receive as "somewhat lesser" (153) and "somewhat other" (154) than the esse tantum of God, their interrelationship is not fully fleshed out. Further discussion of how esse is received would be helpful, particularly since Kerr wants to contrast Aquinas with views on which there is a fundamental existential quantifier that applies in the same way to everything.

Kerr concludes the chapter by addressing some theological concerns about conceiving of God as pure being. First, he shows that, on Aquinas's metaphysics, God is clearly not an abstract object (pace Alvin Plantinga) but rather an individual. Kerr then relates esse tantum to the theological revelation of God as "I am" and discusses how bestowing being can be seen as an act of gratuitous love.

Chapter seven looks at the implications of the esse/essentia distinction for the metaphysics of creation. Here there is a real pay-off from Kerr's earlier work. He helps us to see why, for Aquinas, the initial creation of a being and its continued existence are one act of continuous creation: the act of giving esse to a being. Kerr also explains why, on the Thomistic framework, cosmological questions about whether the universe has a beginning in time are not crucial for God's existence. Since God is a cause of being for everything, not a cause of the universe's coming to be, whether physicists posit a temporal beginning does not affect Aquinas's proof.

Kerr's book is a welcome addition to the literature on Aquinas's metaphysics. It carefully examines a crucial argument in a way that sheds light on Aquinas's most fundamental principles. Kerr's methodical approach raises key issues and advances discussion even when there is more to be said. I recommend it to anyone interested in medieval metaphysics or proofs of the existence of God.