Aristotle and Beyond: Essays on Metaphysics and Ethics

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Sarah Broadie, Aristotle and Beyond: Essays on Metaphysics and Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 203pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521870245.

Reviewed by Jacob Rosen, New York University


As the title indicates, the twelve essays in this volume address a range of topics in metaphysics and ethics, usually from a recognizably Aristotle-influenced point of view but only sometimes in explicit dialogue with, or explication of, that philosopher. The essays are mostly recent (since 2000), but there are two from the 1970s and one from the '80s. Broadie's work is well known to students of Aristotle, and these essays exhibit her usual high level of insight and interest -- though also a tendency to elliptical and sometimes frustratingly inexplicit argumentation. I will give a synopsis of the papers and then discuss in detail a question which spans four of her essays, on the nature and role of the highest good.

1. 'Affecting and being affected' (1970) proposes some necessary conditions for an activity Φing to be a species of affecting: Φing always has an existing, determinate particular as its object; there is a property F such that if x Φs y then y is F (to some degree), y would have been so if something other than x had Φed it, and y would not have been so if nothing had Φed it; Φ has a contrary Ψ such that nothing can be Φed and Ψed at the same time (nor can anything be Φed to two different degrees at the same time).

2. 'Backwards causation and continuing' (1974) argues that backwards causation is inconceivable, because (1) a cause must continue into the time during which its effect takes place; hence (2) in backwards causation, the cause would have to continue from later to earlier, from a time after the effect into the time of the effect; (3) we cannot conceive of something continuing from later to earlier; therefore (4) we cannot conceive of backwards causation.

3. According to 'From necessity to fate: An inevitable step?' (2001), though Determinism regarding an event E ("it was always necessary that E would/would not occur") does not entail Fatalism about it ("E would/would not have occurred no matter what else occurred beforehand"), it generally does entail Futilism, "the view that rational effort on our part regarding E/not-E is pointless." That's because rational effort has point only if we can tell whether E's occurrence is desirable, and this typically requires assessing counterfactual claims. (The -- questionable -- assumption seems to be that a prospective outcome E is desirable iff either E will occur and things would have been worse if it didn't, or E won't occur and things would have been better if it did.) If determinism is true, we cannot rationally assess these counterfactual claims, because if any particular matter of fact had been different the entire history of the world would have been different, and we have no chance of calculating what things would have been like instead.

4. 'Alternative world-histories' (2002) extends the worry to include all forms of what Broadie calls the "Everything Settled" view (ES). This is the view that everything in the history of the world "is settled at all times in history, or is timelessly settled" (56), in contrast to the view that "there are contingencies or alternative possibilities in the universe, and then matters come to be settled one way or the other in the course of history," so that the world "becomes determinate bit by bit through time" (51-2). Examples of ES include Eternalism in the philosophy of time, as well as determinism. Broadie claims that for any kind of ES-theorist, "counterfactually supposing that E did not happen at t implies counterfactually supposing the never-having-been-actual of the whole of actual-world history" -- and if we make the latter supposition, we again have no chance of calculating what things would have been like instead.

5. In 'A contemporary look at Aristotle's changing Now' (2005), Broadie worries that recent (i.e., since McTaggart) discussion in the philosophy of time has involved a kind of unhealthy dualism regarding its two fundamental aspects of order and passage, leaving it mysterious why these two aspects are found together. She thinks an Aristotelian view does better at exhibiting their unity. On the view she presents, (1) the now changes, not like something moving from one location to another (where the locations exist independently of the moving thing), but more like something altering (where the properties exist only by being instantiated by the altering thing); (2) one event is before another only if it is either nearer to the now in the future or further from the now in the past. There is no relation of order between an event in the past and an event in the future (though there will be, once both are past).

6. 'Nature and craft in Aristotelian teleology' (1987) offers an account of how the nature-craft analogy aids Aristotle's explanation of natural teleology; an argument that the analogy does not import unwanted psychologism into Aristotle's physics, because belief and desire play no role, strictly speaking, in his account of craft activity itself; and a concern that the analogy can mislead us and Aristotle into regarding all natural activity as subordinate to some cosmic practical intelligence (because all crafts are subordinate to practical reason).

7. 'Soul and body in Plato and Descartes' (2001) compares the soul's relation to and separability from the body according to Plato's Phaedo and Descartes' Meditations. Descartes' soul is essentially an intellect, whereas Plato's is essentially a valuer; a Platonic soul is responsible for its own embodiment or separation, by way of its desire for or indifference to bodily enjoyments, whereas a Cartesian soul is not, partly because it can have no such desires unless embodied.

8-11. 'Aristotle and contemporary ethics' (2006); 'On the idea of the summum bonum' (2005); 'What should we mean by 'the highest good'?' (new); 'The good of practical beings: Aristotelian perspectives' (new): see below.

12. In 'Taking stock of leisure' (new), Broadie proposes that one of the distinctive features of humans is "the capacity to appreciate leisure and distinguish it from non-leisure." She develops a range of reflections on leisure, starting from the difference between doing something because you feel like it and doing something because you must, and going on to consider questions about religion, philosophy and art.

Chapters 8-11 share the aim of developing a view on which (a) there is a highest good (or possibly several), but (b) not every decision should aim at achieving or preserving it. In chapters 8 and 11 Broadie attributes a view of this kind to Aristotle, while in chapters 9 and 10 she recommends one on its own merits. Her main reason for attributing claim (b) to Aristotle is his refusal to offer universal principles of action (the thought being, why not offer "always pursue [highest good]," if he endorsed it?). She also says that Aristotle's examples of virtuous activity often don't portray agents as aiming at happiness (the highest good), whether their own or others' (173). (More considerations can be found in 'Against the Grand End View', chapter 4.4 in her Ethics With Aristotle (1991).)

Broadie has three components from which to construct views of the kind she wants. First is a distinction between two "levels" of practical thought: the architectonic, which addresses the large-scale structure of our lives, thus setting the context for smaller-scale activity, and the ground-level, which deals with particular choices and actions while taking the context of each action as given. Second is a separation between questions of right and questions of good. Third is a story about the relation between the highest good and other goods, on which those others need not be any kind of means to the highest.

Chapter 8 introduces the first two components. Even if the highest good is the ultimate end of all goods, it doesn't follow that all right action is for the sake of the highest good (125 n). Architectonic thought and action should always aim at the highest good, but ground-level thought and action should not: its concern is "deciding on right action moralistically conceived" (125). Though this isn't explicit, the idea must be that in ground-level practice we may respond solely to considerations of right, without aiming at any good at all; for at this stage Broadie seems to be granting that all goods are for the sake of the highest good, and hence that when we correctly pursue any good we are ultimately pursuing the highest good. On the other hand, good ground-level agency is itself part of the highest good aimed at in our architectonic thinking.

Chapter 9 again emphasizes the distinction between right and good; Broadie argues plausibly that principles of right and wrong may be grounded independently of the highest good, contrary to J. S. Mill's assumption (in Utilitarianism) that the ancients identified the highest good with the foundation of morality. She also introduces component three, a proposal about the role of highest good in relation to other goods. According to the proposal, the highest good is that whose presence in a life is a necessary condition for anything else's making a difference to the goodness of that life. If V is the highest good then, for all possible lives,

(G1) no life without V is better than any other life without V;

(G2) any life with V is better than any life without V.

(The semi-formalization is my own.) Any life without the highest good is worthless, while any life that includes it has positive value. Other goods can make one life with the highest good better than another. Because they make this difference only among lives with the highest good, Broadie regards the highest good as making them good; it is the "source of value for the other goods" (148). Of course, the other goods need not in any way be means to the highest good.

Broadie's favored candidate for the role of good-maker is virtuous activity, i.e., thinking and acting morally rightly from a steady disposition to do so. Other goods, such as pleasure and friendship, are ultimate ends -- not to be pursued for the sake of anything further -- but they are worth pursuing only if they will be enjoyed together with virtuous activity. Given this structure of goods, we should sometimes focus specifically on the highest one, developing and sustaining our own and others' commitment to doing what is morally right. But while all our activity should be virtuous activity, some of it should aim at nothing (when we act solely on considerations of right), and some of it should aim at non-highest goods as ultimate ends.

This is certainly an interesting ethical picture, worth serious consideration. Unfortunately, it cannot be Aristotle's as it stands, and by the time Broadie returns to him it will have been crucially altered. At the end of chapter 10, Broadie notes that the highest good as good-maker is not the most desirable good, because "it is more desirable to have the good-maker plus the other goods." That can be changed. "The trick," she says,

is to construe 'good-maker' not dispositionally but in terms of actuality. Thus O is a good-maker when and only when it actually, so to speak, does confer value on the other goods -- on the things that have worth only when it is present along with them. But for that to happen, these other things have to be present along with it. Thus the good-maker understood in this way is also what is most desirable. (164)

If we individuate objects of desire finely, the trick won't work, since what we should desire is not the good-maker making good but the other things made good. Perhaps Broadie thinks desires are identical if they are necessarily co-satisfied. At any rate, by the end of chapter 11 she is indifferent between saying that the highest good -- now Aristotle's highest good -- is the good-maker actually making good the other goods, and saying that it is a combination of the good-maker with the other goods. "This would seem to be a distinction without an ethical difference" (183). The good-maker is virtuous activity (more accurately, the disjunction of virtuous activity with excellent theoretical activity: either will make life worthwhile and confer value on other goods). The highest good is happiness.

The difference between potential and actual good-maker is greater than Broadie lets on. First, the highest good as actual good-maker is not something required for anything to make a difference to the goodness of a life: it does not meet condition G1 above. Two non-happy lives can differ in goodness if only one includes virtuous activity, or if the other elements of a complete life are not equally present in them. More important, the highest good is now something to which every good contributes: every good, by being an object of value-conferring, is a means to the presence of an actual good-maker; on one of Broadie's formulations, every good is a constituent of the highest good.

So Broadie abandons, perhaps unconsciously, one ground for denying that every good should be chosen for the sake of the highest good. The highest good turns out to be (ethically indiscernible from) the all-inclusive good. It has an interesting internal structure -- a number of elements along with a good-maker on whose presence their goodness depends -- but that isn't what Broadie offered to tell us about. (In fact, why think Aristotle believed in a good-maker? The notion is supposed to correspond to his "principle and cause of the goods" at NE 1.12, 1102a3-4, but Aristotle applies that phrase to happiness, which does not satisfy G1 and G2, rather than virtuous activity, which according to Broadie does.)

That leaves the distinction between right and good, and the two levels of practical thought. As to the first, though Aristotle may have admitted independently grounded principles of right, it is implausible that he thought actions or decisions should ever be motivated solely by them. He says in various contexts that every action and decision, indeed every animal movement, aims at some (real or apparent) good. This means that unless some non-highest goods should be pursued as ultimate ends, every action and decision should aim at the highest good.

Finally, the distinction between architectonic and ground-level activity. Broadie could maintain that virtue requires us to have a range of ground-level ultimate ends, so that, since virtuous activity is the core of happiness, we can be happy only if we don't always pursue happiness: we must keep an architectonic eye on happiness while pursuing other things at the ground level. It's a fine story and maybe an ancient one, but should we think it was Aristotle's? The "two level" component insulates it from defeat by straightforward counterexample: e.g., when Aristotle says that we all do all things for the sake of happiness (NE 1.12, 1102a2-3), he is referring to us "as engaged in architectonic practice, not as engaged in practice in general" (125 n). But there is no clear-cut evidence that Aristotle subscribed to this separation of levels. The proposal has to be assessed holistically, by seeing whether it yields a satisfying, economical overall interpretation of Aristotle's ethical writings. I won't attempt that here.