Aristotle on Homonymy: Dialectic and Science

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Julie K. Ward, Aristotle on Homonymy: Dialectic and Science, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 220pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521874861.

Reviewed by David Evans, Queen's University Belfast


Ambiguity is an important theme in Aristotle's philosophy. As anyone even moderately familiar with his work will know, he devotes a great deal of attention to analysing the key notions in each area of investigation. It turns out that virtually all of them exhibit such complexity that no unitary account can be given of their nature. Moreover not only does Aristotle lay bare ambiguities where earlier philosophers had not expected them; he also theorises about the phenomenon, under his preferred title of homonymy, and discovers that it too is complex in ways that yield philosophical dividends.

This is the subject of Julie Ward's well conceived and finely executed study. She has three main topics: 1) the nature of homonymy, with special reference to the cases of inter-connected items which she calls "core-dependent" homonymy; 2) the role of dialectic in exploring homonymy, and its relation to science; 3) some core-dependent cases of homonymy, such as being, nature and friendship, which are philosophically important.

Ward's starting point is the discussion of homonymy, synonymy and paronymy in Categories. A key question for her will be the compatibility of this discussion and the analyses of core-dependent homonymy in other works of Aristotle. She argues against incompatibility, and goes on later to defend the thesis that homonymy in Aristotle covers a range of cases, from accidental or "chance" ambiguities to the philosophically more interesting cases where the meanings and the things which they mean are connected. Since the discussion in Categories is notable for the absence of any reference to the intellectual background from which it may have emerged, she speculates that it is not, as is often supposed, Speusippus but rather Plato who was the main influence. His account of the eponymous relation of sensible particulars to Forms is a precursor of Aristotle's account of secondary to primary items in a core-dependent homonymous set.

Ward argues that the examination of homonymy has a central role in Aristotelian dialectic. She gives a detailed analysis of the account of homonymy in Topics, especially A15 and A18. This account is of a piece with that in Categories; and although it treats all cases of homonymy as equally significant for the dialectical purpose of premise-discovery, and does not explicitly single out core-dependent homonymy, some of the examples in the Topics discussion clearly anticipate the insights which Aristotle deploys in Metaphysics and other works outside the Organon.

She then turns to a thorough analysis of core-dependent homonymy in these works, concentrating on the cases of healthy, medical and (what these first two are meant to illuminate) being. Fifty years ago G.E.L. Owen drew attention to these discussions, emphasising the ground-breaking nature of what he called the notion of focal meaning. Ward maintains that Owen's emphasis on the semantic, as opposed to the ontological, nature of these analyses is mistaken, and that his detection of an inconsistency between the works of the Organon and Metaphysics countenancing a strong thesis of development in Aristotle, is similarly unjustified. Her own analysis of these cases concentrates on what it is that connects the different elements; and following indications from the Renaissance philosopher Cajetan and the contemporary Christopher Shields, she favours an account which mainly runs with Aristotle's theory of causation. She defends this pattern of analysis for the case of being; substance is the primary element in a causal network which connects all the homonymously related cases of what there is.

Moving on from Metaphysics, Ward considers two further cases -- nature and friendship -- which have received only slight commentary in the literature. The first provides unproblematic illustration and confirmation of the analyses already advanced. The case of friendship is less straightforward; although it is undoubtedly presented as a core-dependent phenomenon in Eudemian Ethics, causality works less clearly among the components, which may explain why Aristotle departs from this analysis in Nicomachean Ethics. Finally she turns to the relation between Aristotle's conceptions of dialectic and science. It might be supposed that homonymy and scientific knowledge are completely at variance, given the emphasis in Posterior Analytics on the need to avoid ambiguity in the terms through which scientific demonstrations are presented. However Ward argues that the methods of Topics A15 for detecting homonymy are useful for the evaluation of nominal definitions, and that these definitions can be converted to the statements of essence appropriate to proper science by attending to the same causal connections as are explored in core-dependent homonymy. In this way Aristotle's claims at the beginning of Topics, about the value of dialectic in discovering scientific first principles, are substantiated.

This summary has aimed to reproduce the main elements in Ward's continuing argument. It does not follow her many detailed examinations of individual Aristotelian texts nor the careful assessment of alternative interpretations. The book is certainly a dense read (with each paragraph about as long as a page of this review); albeit mitigated by some summaries and recapitulations; and there are some infelicities in sub-editing, e.g. p.156, para.3, line 4, p.181, para.2, second sentence.

This book is bound to generate fruitful discussion; and I proceed to indicate some queries of my own. In Categories Aristotle's only example of homonymy concerns the word "zoion"; and she takes the point to be that both real animals and representations of them may be called animals. This ignores the other possible translation of the word here, which is "picture". In fact that translation seems preferable, since otherwise homonymy would have to embrace all general predicates, given that it is in principle possible to represent anything, pictorially or in other ways. Ward's interpretation (which, it should be said, is the mainstream one) may be one factor that encourages her to find Platonic ancestry for the theory of core-dependent homonymy. However she does not pursue this idea in the main body of her argument; after its appearance in chapter 1, it reappears only in a concluding Afterword. That seems wise. Part of the merit of Aristotle's theory is that it is sparingly applied and certainly does not extend to all general predicates as, according to Aristotle's own criticism, Plato's theory tends to do.

In the book much discussion is devoted to core-dependent homonymy; but the curious reader might still wonder what precisely this is. She quotes approvingly Shields' formulation of various criteria, of which the first is "if two things, a and b, are homonymously F and a is a core-instance of F, then a and b have a name in common" (p.154). But consider the paradigm case of "healthy": what is the core-instance a that is healthy? One might suppose that it is the person or the animal body. But Ward says that such things are "receptive of" health, thereby indicating that these are secondary rather than core cases of being healthy. Of course health, which is at the core of the notion, is not itself healthy; and on reflection it becomes hard to see that we are dealing here with homonymy, rather than some form of paronymy.

In her analysis of core-dependent homonymy important work is done by her application of (Aristotelian) causal analysis. To be sure, Aristotle says that we know things when we know their causes. However a general criticism of this approach is that Aristotelian causality is too vague and multi-faceted to be effectively illuminating. A more particular difficulty is Ward's inclination to invoke the idea of an "exemplary" cause in order to flesh out the programme of causal analysis. Aristotle does indeed speak of the formal cause as a paradeigma in one passage; but to regard this as his considered view of form takes us once again too far in the direction of Platonism.

Julie Ward's title captures very accurately the overall direction of her argument. She maintains that in its exploration of homonymy dialectic provides a tool that well fits it to advance our understanding from a prescientific to a fully scientific stage. The claim receives its best illustration from the science of ontology, which depends on the phenomenon of core-dependent homonymy for it status as a unitary science. What needs to be emphasised, too, is that ontology is very likely the only such science; even if we accept a core-dependent analysis of the homonymy of 'physis', Aristotle makes no use of this in his characterisation of what natural philosophy is and how widely it ranges. What distinguishes ontology from all other sciences in Aristotle is the generality of its subject-matter. This is the feature which, as Aristotle points out (Met. B1, 995a18-25, cf. De Soph. El. 11, 172a11-13), it most obviously shares with dialectic. Dialectic and scientific ontology have unrestricted scope in a way that is found in no other intellectual activity. We might conclude that this line of thought, rather than the applications of homonymy, offers the more promising link between dialectic and science.

I have indicated some areas where it would be fruitful to continue the debate which this very cogent study will surely stimulate.