Aristotle on Matter, Form, and Moving Causes: The Hylomorphic Theory of Substantial Generation

Placeholder book cover

Devin Henry, Aristotle on Matter, Form, and Moving Causes: The Hylomorphic Theory of Substantial Generation, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 236pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108475570.

Reviewed by Mary Katrina Krizan, University of Wisconsin-La Crosse


In this book, Devin Henry defends Aristotle's commitment to a hylomorphic model of substantial generation. In the first chapters, he defends an interpretation of form, matter, and efficient cause within Aristotle's general account of substantial generation. Then, he applies the broader theory in order to explain the most interesting cases of substantial generation -- those of living things, and particularly animals. The book culminates with a view toward the good of biological generation.

Henry's book succeeds in its goal of defending a hylomorphic model of substantial generation that is broadly consistent across multiple texts, which range from rather theoretical texts such as Book I of the Physics and On Generation and Corruption to the more specific applications of theory such as appear in the Generation of Animals. Furthermore, the book develops a role for the often neglected efficient cause as a source of motion that directs a process toward its end.

Henry's book also succeeds in its broader goal of offering an interpretation of Aristotle that remains accessible to non-specialists while engaging with core debates in the literature. It engages with issues in the primary texts enough to satisfy scholars of ancient Greek philosophy, yet such engagement is accessible to those with a general understanding of Plato and Aristotle. As such, it should be recommended to philosophers and students with an interest in Aristotle's biology and its place within Aristotle's broader theory of substantial generation.

Chapter 1 sets out Aristotle's responses to the Eleatic Challenge in Physics I.8 and On Generation and Corruption (GC) I.3. Whereas thinkers such as Parmenides denied that anything can come into being from what is not, Aristotle's theory of substantial generation requires precisely this possibility. Henry shows that in Physics I.8, Aristotle accepts the Eleatic contention that nothing can come to be from what is not, in the unqualified sense, but explains the possibility of coming to be by introducing an incomplete or predicative use of "what is not". In GC I.3, Aristotle accepts the possibility of generation out of unqualified non-being by characterizing unqualified non-being as incomplete being. Since incomplete being is substance in a state of potentiality rather than completion, generation can occur out of incomplete being, and hence, generation can occur out of unqualified non-being.

Chapters 2-4 develop the general hylomorphic model of substantial generation, which Henry will apply to explain biological generation in Chapters 5-8. Chapter 2 begins with the hylomorphic model of substantial generation found in Book I of the Physics; here, generation requires a subject S and contraries F and G, where F and G are privation and form. Some readers of Aristotle maintain that S must satisfy two conditions: (1) the subject condition, according to which S is a subject from which something comes to be non-incidentally, and (2) the persistence condition, according to which S must persist through the change as a constituent of what comes to be. Henry agrees that the subject condition is correct, but argues that because Physics I.7 remains undeveloped with respect to the persistence condition, it does not find support in Physics I.7.

In Chapter 3, Henry defends a restrictive reading of the subject of substantial generation by denying the persistence condition. He shows that in GC I.1-4, unqualified generation requires radical transformation in the subject; something entirely new comes to be in unqualified generation. Furthermore, he argues that there is no inconsistency in the doctrines of Physics I.7 and GC I.1-4. Since Physics I.7 is undeveloped with respect to the persistence condition, the denial of it in GC I.1-4 represents a further development in Aristotle's thought rather than a shift in his view. Henry notes that his interpretation can explain why, in the Generation of Animals (GA), Aristotle does not introduce a material continuant explanatory of biological generation: since substantial generation requires radical transformation, a material continuant is not necessary.

In Chapter 4, Henry turns to what he calls the "extended hylomorphic model", which is found in GC II.9. The extended hylomorphic model, as summarized at the end of the chapter, distinguishes three factors: (1) matter, or the subject from which generation proceeds; (2) form, or the end toward which generation progresses; and (3) the efficient cause, which directs the process toward form. Aristotle is careful to distinguish his own model of generation from materialist-type theories, including those which recognized an efficient cause; those models do not sufficiently account for goodness, order, and beauty in natural generation. Likewise, Aristotle distinguishes his account from formalist-type theories, which fail to explain the observable efficient cause necessary to distinguish being and becoming. Aristotle's innovation is to distinguish the efficient cause from the formal cause; the efficient cause, in this sense, directs a process of change toward its end.

In Chapters 5-8, Henry turns to the application of the general hylomorphic model of substantial generation, developed in Chapters 2-4, and shows how it explains biological generation. He identifies two aspects of reproductive hylomorphism in GA: embryogenesis, in which a primitive embryo is first generated, and morphogenesis, in which the primitive embryo is brought to completion as a fully formed living thing. Both processes invoke the general hylomorphic model of substantial generation, and furthermore, allow for a consistent treatment of the efficient and final causes of biological generation.

Chapter 5 focuses on the first aspect of biological generation. Here, Henry shows that Aristotle invokes the hylomorphic model in order to explain the contributions of male and female parents with respect to form and matter: the male provides the form, and the female provides the matter. On Henry's account of embryogenesis, matter and form can be thought of in nearly a quantitative or spatial way: the matter of the female has indeterminate boundaries, whereas the male parent provides form, in the sense of the shape or boundary that gives structure to the matter.

An especially helpful outline on pages 128-129 shows that the menstrual blood of the female is the subject that is transformed in embryogenesis, and the embryo, in turn, is the subject that is transformed in morphogenesis. Even menstrual blood is generated from a previous process that itself requires a subject; food is a subject that is converted to blood; blood, in turn, is the subject that is converted to menstrual blood. In each stage, there is a pre-existing subject that is transformed, in line with the general hylomorphic account defended in Chapters 2-4.

Chapter 6 turns to the second aspect of biological generation: this is morphogenesis, which begins with the embryo as its subject and changes it into a living thing that is the same in kind as its parents. Henry argues that although the male parent only contributes capacities associated with soul, it does not follow that the female parent contributes only the matter; rather, the male parent contributes the sensory capacities, whereas the female parent contributes nutritive capacities. This explains why wind-eggs can grow and decay; they are not literally plants because they are incomplete animals, but nonetheless, exhibit nutritive capacities. Furthermore, Henry shows that his account is consistent with the unity of the soul. Parts of the soul are not literally contained in semen and blood, nor do they arise in different parts of the animal body; rather, semen and blood contribute motions that provide the embryo with its developmental capacities.

Chapter 7 introduces a possible problem for the efficient cause of generation. On the one hand, the father is the efficient cause of generation, and explains the generation of an animal and its parts. On the other hand, a nature, as explained in Physics II.1, is an internal principle of motion and change. Living things appear different from artifacts because they possess natures, or internal principles of motion and change; yet since they are brought about by the male parent, it may appear that their principles of motion and change are external.

Henry shows that this problem is avoided in GA II.1 by distinguishing the primary and proximate efficient cause of generation. In biological generation, the father, through semen, is the primary efficient cause of embryogenesis. Once an embryo has been formed, it can manage on its own; thus, the further development of an embryo occurs due to its nature. There are two roles for formal nature: that of efficient cause, which generates a substance, and that of an end, which is the mature form that defines the substance and specifies the goals of its development.

Chapter 8 defends Aristotle's appeal to an architectonic model of natural generation, which has its origins in Plato's Timaeus and Statesman. In the Timaeus, Plato shows that reason is the primary cause of beauty and goodness; although the elemental forces are co-causes, they cannot, on their own, explain beauty and goodness. Furthermore, the role of reason in the Timaeus is like that of the statesman; like the statesman, reason in the Timaeus is not engaged in the practical task of generation, but rather coordinates the necessary interactions of simple bodies in order to bring about the good in a deliberate rather than chance way.

Henry argues that Aristotle's account of biological generation employs an extended and naturalized version of the architectonic model. For Aristotle, the formal nature of a living thing operates as a primary cause productive of order, goodness, and beauty, and is needed to explain processes -- such as the survival of an embryo -- that cannot be explained by an appeal to material necessity alone. The formal nature thus supplies what is missing from the account of an efficient cause in GC II.9. Nonetheless, the architectonic model of biological generation does not imply that all biological processes occur for the sake of something; certain affects and organs, such as variations in eye color and the omentum, are the results of necessity alone.

In the Appendix to Chapter 8, Henry briefly defends an alternative to a distinction between primary and secondary teleology, as recently proposed by Mariska Leunissen. The distinction is motivated by two kinds of cases: (1) those in which the formal nature makes the materials that it needs to form a part, and (2) those in which the formal nature makes use of materials that are already present due to material necessity. In short, cases of type (1) fall under primary teleology, and their products are essential to the continued existence of an organism; cases of type (2) fall under secondary teleology, and their products are helpful for living things but are not vital and essential. Henry argues that cases of types (1) and (2) do not employ distinctive types of natural teleology, but rather, both are explained by the same teleological axiom: inquiry in biology should be conducted so as to discover both necessary and final causes. On the architectonic model of biological generation, there is no need to distinguish two distinct and mutually exclusive kinds of teleological causation.

In Chapter 9, Henry turns to the cosmological significance of biological generation. On a cosmological account of the significance of biological generation, Aristotle's teleology cannot be understood in isolation from his cosmological theory; the generation of organisms contributes to the good of the cosmos. On a strong organism-centered account, biological generation should be considered from the perspective of the organism, and hence, generation is good for the organism. Henry defends a weaker version of an organism-centered account and shows that the generation of an organism contributes both to its own good and to the good of the cosmos. Eternal lineages of species are good because they are continuous; the existence of sexes makes them possible, and the separation of sexes makes generation better. Eternal lineages are nonetheless constituted by contingent beings, and hence generation is required in order to maintain the continuity of the cycle. The universe does not directly benefit from the continuity of generation; rather, the species seems to be the beneficiary.

Henry's book challenges the reader to think carefully about the relationship between Aristotle's broader hylomorphic framework and its application in explaining the generation of animals. In doing so, it offers a theory that spans a critical juncture often missed in the literature; substantial generation in general is treated as one topic and biological generation as another. It is at precisely this juncture that I wish to raise a few questions.

Henry argues that embryogenesis and morphogenesis are different stages or processes of generation. Furthermore, both can be explained by the general hylomorphic model defended in Chapters 2-4, according to which an incomplete being -- a subject -- is radically transformed in substantial generation. Both embryogenesis and morphogenesis begin with a subject; in the former, the subject is the menstrual blood, and in the latter, the subject is an embryo. Likewise, both processes result in a product that is distinct from the original subject; in the former, an embryo, and in the latter, an organism with the same shape and form as its parents.

On Henry's account of substantial generation, the subject from which generation begins is also the pre-existing matter; for this reason, there is no further layer of matter that persists or survives so as to constitute the product. Indeed, this is the point of radical transformation, which seems to be confirmed in GC I.1-4; unqualified generation requires that once substantial generation has occurred, nothing of what previously existed is left. Nonetheless, the absence of a persisting matter raises a few questions for embryogenesis and morphogenesis.

First, it is unclear that embryogenesis requires the radical transformation of pre-existing matter. In embryogenesis, the male semen gives shape and form to the female menstrual blood, causing it to set; Henry calls this a mechanical process. Although the embryo is not identical with menstrual blood, it is not clear that menstrual blood itself undergoes a radical transformation; rather, the menstrual blood has been changed in virtue of some dispositional property (such as being able to be thickened) that it possessed prior to the process and still retains.

Second, morphogenesis raises a different type of question; now, it is unclear what functions as the constitutive matter of the product, the animal that has the same shape and form as its parents. It is clear that embryos do not constitute fully developed animals; as a starting point for transformation, the embryo does not survive. Yet if embryos are made out of menstrual blood, along with its various dispositional properties, perhaps that blood is also the constitutive matter of the fully developed animal and its heterogeneous parts.

These two cases are not decisive, but nonetheless provide some reasons for finding a persistence condition in substantial generation. On an alternative account that employs a persistence condition, there is a difference between the subject from which generation begins (such as the menstrual blood or the embryo) and the matter that eventually constitutes something (such as the embryo or the mature organism). The subject from which generation begins is radically transformed, but the constitutive matter is not: rather, it retains certain dispositional properties, but ceases to be identified by them.

Whether or not these questions are genuinely problematic for Henry's account cannot be decided here; to decide them would require a careful reconsideration of GC I.1-4 as well as Meteorology 4 and various passages from Aristotle's biology. Instead, these questions emphasize what is important about this book. In offering an account that brings together Aristotle's general hylomorphic account of generation and its use in biological contexts, Henry provides a starting point for further conversations between areas of Aristotle's natural philosophy that are sometimes examined in isolation from one another. In doing so, it provides an important contribution to Aristotle scholarship and the history of the philosophy of science.