Aristotle's Ethics: Moral Development and Human Nature

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Hope May, Aristotle's Ethics: Moral Development and Human Nature, Continuum, 2010, 189pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826491107.

Reviewed by Jozef Müller, University of Florida


In Aristotle's Ethics: Moral Development and Human Nature, Hope May defends two main theses. First, ethical virtue (which includes both the virtues of thought and character) is a developmental prerequisite for contemplative excellence (and, hence, for eudaimonia). Second, although we can no longer accept Aristotle's view that a life of contemplation is the only truly good life, his ethical outlook, including his views about human motivation and the role of virtues in enabling one to achieve a good life are still relevant and defensible. His theory can easily be modernized and can contribute to our current ethical or psychological debates. The book divides into two parts: chapters 1 to 3 deal with the first thesis, chapters 4 to 6 with the second thesis. I will summarize May's argument in each part and then raise some objections. I will conclude with some general critical remarks on her project.

In chapters 1-3, May develops her interpretation of some of the central issues of Aristotle's ethics, such as his views about eudaimonia and the role of virtues in a good life. In chapter 1, she introduces Aristotle's famous function argument (EN 1.7), in which Aristotle argues for a certain conception of the human good. She then outlines the main interpretative challenges posed by Aristotle's conflicting accounts of the human good in the function argument (as well as his discussion of moral virtues in books 1-9 of EN) and in book 10 of the Nicomachean Ethics. She argues that the debate between the view that eudaimonia is just contemplative activity (intellectualism) and the view that eudaimonia is "a complex, multidimensional end composed of several rational activities, namely, ethically virtuous and contemplative activities" (15) (inclusivism) can be resolved by what she calls developmentalism (i.e., the view that ethical virtues are necessary for contemplative activity). She develops this view in chapters 2 and 3.

In chapter 2, May argues for a developmentalist interpretation of the function argument. Her aim is to make the argument sound. In particular, she wants to defend Aristotle's use of an analogy between bodily organs and human beings. Aristotle seems to infer that human beings have an ergon (function) from the fact that bodily organs have an ergon. She draws attention to Aristotle's assertion that the ergon of a given organism is determined by the idion of a given kind of organism. She then cites a passage from the Generation of Animals (736b3-5) in which Aristotle claims that in the process of the development of an animal of a given species "the end is developed last, and the idion is the end of each [species'] development." To her mind this view justifies Aristotle's claim that since various human organs have an ergon, so also human beings have an ergon. According to her,

this inference makes perfect sense. Aristotle believes that nature designs each organism to perform a specific function and this function is determined by the organism's idion. Aristotle's inference that man has an ergon from the premise that the eye, hand, and foot, each have an ergon … is an expression of Aristotle's belief that the parts of the body are there for the sake of nature's target -- the idion of the organism (43).

In chapter 3, May argues that ethical virtues are a necessary developmental prerequisite for contemplative excellence. Her argument has two parts. First, a virtuous person finds rational activities pleasant, so moral virtues guarantee that he will also find contemplation pleasant, and so he will engage in it for its own sake. Second, practical wisdom (phronesis) enables the virtuous person to correctly determine when and where to contemplate, as well as, in cooperation with moral virtue, to protect the virtuous person from various 'mishaps' such as excessive passions that can distort one's judgments or perception.

May's interpretation of the function argument is problematic. Perhaps the most serious problem is that her interpretation does not seem to make sound Aristotle's alleged inference from the fact that human organs have a function to the conclusion that human beings have a function. There are several claims she makes that should make this inference sound, but none of them seems to work. For example, she claims that Aristotle believes that each organism has an ergon which is determined by the organism's idion and that that belief makes the inference work. But that belief clearly implies, by itself, that human beings have an ergon (since they are organisms). The analogy with bodily organs plays no role in this inference. In fact, one might think that if the argument from organs' ergon to the organism's ergon is supposed to prove or provide support for anything, it is supposed to do it for the thesis that organisms, as such, have erga. May also claims that the inference goes through because of the (alleged) fact that the bodily parts of a given organism are there, ultimately, for the sake of the idion of the organism (i.e., that what they do -- their ergon -- is, ultimately, aimed at enabling the development and functioning of one's reason). But this claim justifies, at best, the inference that an organism's ergon is there also for the sake of something (since so are the erga of its organs), not that the organism, as a whole, has an ergon (for that claim is already being asserted in the premise). Moreover, the claim that bodily parts exist for the sake of an organism's idion (in the human case, reason) seems to me false. In support of this claim May cites several passages in the Parts of Animals (658a-664a). But none of these passages appears to support this view. May claims that lips, eyebrows, or the larynx come to be and develop in an animal for the sake of the animal's idion. But Aristotle says, rather, that, for example, the larynx exists for the sake of respiration (PA 664a16) -- a claim that seems more reasonable than May's view that it exists for the sake of reason.

May's argument in chapter 3 strikes me as problematic as well. First, even if she is right that moral and practical intellectual virtues are necessary for contemplative excellence, she seems to me to miss the point of the recent debates among the scholars of Aristotle. The worry is not primarily whether or not one needs (necessarily) moral virtues for a life of contemplation. The worry is, rather, that if eudaimonia is contemplation, moral virtues (even if necessary for eudaimonia) are only valuable instrumentally (as the means to it) and that that would contradict Aristotle's own account of virtues as being valuable in themselves. It might well be that it is necessary for me to sleep every day if I am to achieve, maintain, and exercise contemplative excellence. But that does not make sleep something valuable for its own sake. It does not help to say that virtues are the motivational preconditions for achieving eudaimonia (84), since that has no impact on their value being instrumental.

Moreover, May does not seem to me to sufficiently support her view that moral virtues are necessary for contemplative excellence. The strongest support for this thesis seems to me to be her claim that moral virtue guarantees that one will find contemplation pleasant since it makes one value and be appropriately sensitive or attuned to rational pleasures, which is a precondition for engaging in contemplation for its own sake. This claim seems to me to be reasonable and quite defensible. Indeed, May provides some good examples and arguments for it. Regrettably, she goes far beyond this claim when she makes finding virtuous activities pleasant not only necessary for engaging in them in the right way but also sufficient for engaging in them in the right way. In fact she makes an even more sweeping claim. She says that Aristotle believes that "those who excel at an activity do so because they find the activity pleasurable" (71). One could perhaps excuse this as a simple imprecision of expression, but a bit later she adds: "When one finds an activity pleasurable, one is motivated to pursue that activity. And when one is motivated to pursue an activity one excels at that activity" (71). Not only does Aristotle never make a claim of this sort, but he would be plainly wrong if he did. There are many examples of people who enjoy certain activities and are motivated to pursue them for their own sake, but who do not thereby excel in those activities (unless we were to grant that whoever has a real hobby, such as playing guitar or painting, excels in it). It is possible to maintain that finding an activity pleasant is necessary for engaging in it for its own sake (even though this claim would require much defense) without also claiming that finding an activity pleasant is sufficient for excelling in it.

These implausible claims seem to me to originate in a serious interpretative mistake in May's book: her view that Aristotle was, essentially, a hedonist. This view is never explicitly defended, but it appears in a number of passages and permeates her account of Aristotle's theory of human motivation. For example, she thinks that all desires are ultimately desires for pleasure, ignoring Aristotle's distinction between various kinds of rational and non-rational desires. She says: "one ultimately desires some activity because it leads to pleasure" (55). Again, in commenting on Aristotle's view that some people have a wrong view of eudaimonia, she says, "Aristotle's point … is that the 'good,' that is, the pleasurable affect that comprises one's calling can be wrong" (57). In fact, she goes as far as to say that: "Pleasurable affect is the most final cause of a human being's actions" (56). It is obvious, to any reader of Aristotle, that pleasure plays a crucial role in his ethics. But it is hardly the role that May assigns to it. Aristotle clearly asserts that pleasure is not the good, and that we would pursue many things even if no pleasure would result from them (EN 1174a2-13). Although May is right in drawing attention to the role of pleasure in virtuous activity, she makes serious mistakes in fleshing out this role.

In chapters 4-6, May attempts to modernize Aristotle's ethics and make it relevant to contemporary psychology. There are two main ideas presented in these chapters. First, we can modernize Aristotle's ethics by substituting the notion of self-concordance for his conception of eudaimonia as contemplation. This substitution is clearly meant to satisfy the modern demand for a variety of equally good ways of living, since there seems to be no objective measure as to what the values and interest of a person should be. When we do this, we get what May calls a "self-determination theory" of human motivation. By self-concordant activity May means "intrinsically motivated teleological activity" (103). Self-concordant activity is, on her view, an activity which aligns with one's values and interest and which one therefore finds pleasant. This kind of activity is important for (or perhaps constitutes) eudaimonia because it satisfies our basic need for autonomy. May explains autonomy as perceiving one's actions as originating in oneself rather than in something external, such as in the demands of society or parents. It is this perception that is responsible for the peculiar pleasure of one's own agency (104), in addition to the pleasure stemming from the fact that the action aligns with one's values and interest. May then argues at length that Aristotle was aware of the pleasures of autonomy and their importance for a good life.

Her second idea is that various components of "executive function" (i.e., the sum of abilities that enable one to engage in goal-directed behavior), such as motivational or navigational abilities, need to be excellent if one is to develop and engage in self-concordant activities. This is the modernized version of her claim that Aristotelian virtues (of both thought and character) are a developmental prerequisite for contemplative excellence. She devotes a lot of space to the idea of private speech (by which she means the use of speech to communicate to oneself) as something that can help one develop, regulate, and maintain various appropriate habits essential to self-concordance. Again, she finds the idea of private speech already in Aristotle, especially in his assertion that non-rational desires can listen to reason, which she interprets as our ability to regulate, habituate, and motivate ourselves by the use of private speech.

Many ideas that May presents in this second part of the book are interesting and worth considering. However, she seems to me to underestimate the task of appropriating Aristotle into modern psychology. For example, the idea that any activity which stems from one's own deep values and interests will do as the activity that constitutes one's eudaimonia is deeply un-Aristotelian. For if one's interests are trivial and if one's values reflect these interests, then the resulting life, even though perhaps deeply pleasant, will certainly not be good, as Aristotle sees it. May can think that this would work because she thinks that Aristotle is a hedonist and so, in principle, any life that offers deeply satisfying pleasures will do as a good life. But Aristotle is not a hedonist. May seems to miss an important aspect of ancient ethics: the idea that a good life is not only pleasant, but also a life that is worth living. It might well be that certain lives are pleasant and full of self-concordant activities (as May envisages them) but that they are not as worth living as other lives are. Perhaps this is not so foreign to a modern way of thinking either (after all, one might think that many lives, though tragic and full of pain, were nevertheless very much worth living).

May seems to me also to go astray when she tries to find in Aristotle's writings counterparts to such notions as autonomy (in the way she thinks of it) or private speech. For example, none of the passages she refers to as containing the idea of a private speech (127) has anything to do with it (for example, readers can look at the definition of moral virtue at 1106b36-1107a2, which is one of the passages she cites, to confirm this for themselves). She seems to me to come closer to Aristotle's idea that non-rational desires can listen to reason when she thinks that one can (by the use of private speech) stir one's attention away from bad thoughts or desires to good ones (138). But she does not explore how such stirring of one's attention is possible and what mechanisms underlie it (whether in Aristotle or elsewhere). It is very doubtful that Aristotle thought that this can happen by simply talking to oneself.

I would like to conclude with some general critical remarks about the book. First, it is not entirely clear who the intended audience of the book is. Some passages in the book recall lectures prepared for undergraduate students. This is evidenced, for example, by various unnecessary explanations. Perhaps most strikingly May explains at length the difference between normal, comparative, and superlative forms of adjectives (3), a distinction that any professional philosopher is surely well aware of. But there are also rather frequent references to quotes from movies (e.g., 62) or pop songs (e.g., 25 or 29) as expressing some philosophical thoughts, references to Wikipedia as containing useful summaries of psychological theories (see notes 12 and 18 to chapter 4, or note 1 to chapter 5), and a lack of proper references to passages in Aristotle (May only gives references to pages, skipping references to lines -- e.g., the reference to the definition of ethical virtue, cited above, is simply 1106b-1107a).

May's usage of technical terminology is also questionable. She attempts to explain Aristotle by translating his theory into modern terms or by inventing her own terminology that she substitutes for Aristotle's. The problem is that such substitutions often lead to distortions. A good example of this procedure is in the opening pages of the book where she attempts to explain or illuminate Aristotle's conception of eudaimonia by terms like awakening, enlightenment, or self-actualization (1). Clearly, such terms come in handy when she later develops the notion of self-concordance as a substitute for Aristotle's notion of eudaimonia (where self-concordance turns out to be something like self-realization), but they are at best not helpful (and at worst misleading) when explaining what Aristotle meant by eudaimonia. Here is another example. May first explains Aristotle's theory of rational desire or wish as the desire for what one thinks is good (28-29). She then introduces the term "calling" for a wish that is the desire for the most final object of a craftsman (30). She then, on the basis of a passage from De Motu Animalium (701b), which May claims says that (any) desire is for the pleasant (I have not been able to identify the passage she has in mind), concludes that a calling (being a desire) is also for the pleasant. This in turn makes wish identical with appetite (a desire for the pleasant), which is an identification that Aristotle would certainly not approve of. These seem to me to be serious problems. Perhaps the book is meant more for psychologists than philosophers. This could explain some of the peculiar features I have discussed. But it would be good to make this clear to the reader, since the topic of the book gives rise to quite different expectations.

Despite the many critical remarks I have made, I would like to conclude with some positive observations. May has written a book that can be very useful in bringing Aristotle's ethics to the attention of psychologists or other academics. Her book is rich with psychological insights and with ideas about how Aristotle's views can be profitably used in psychological practice. Although the book could profit from a more rigorous treatment of Aristotle's philosophy, May deserves a lot of credit for attempting to defend Aristotle as a good psychologist who can still offer us much insight and advice.