Aristotle's Moral Realism Reconsidered: Phenomenological Ethics

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Pavlos Kontos, Aristotle's Moral Realism Reconsidered: Phenomenological Ethics, Routledge, 2011, 201pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415896740.

Reviewed by Joseph Karbowski, University of Notre Dame


Aristotle's Moral Realism Reconsidered: Phenomenological Ethics is an extremely ambitious work that combines detailed Aristotle and Kant exegesis with philosophical engagement across analytic and continental traditions. Its author, Pavlos Kontos, aims to develop a novel form of moral realism via an Aristotle-inspired phenomenological analysis of moral experience. Kontos' central idea is that moral experience in the guise of phronetic perception provides direct access to a stable moral realm shared by all practically rational beings.

Kontos attempts to vindicate this proposal by exploiting the analogy between phronetic perception and perception of the 'common sensibles' suggested by Aristotle in NE VI. Just as we perceive the movement of an object by 'synthesizing' a number of factors, e.g., its unity, size, temporal phases, etc., so too we perceive the proper appearances of the moral world by synthesizing a number of interdependent moral factors (agents, means, ends, etc.) according to certain categories of practical reason. These categories enable us to see in apparently disparate factors a 'togetherness' that gives rise to a morally evaluable reality composed of what Kontos, following Aristotle, calls 'prakta'. Prakta exhibit 'visibility' and 'solidity': they can be directly grasped by phronetic perception and they also are 'traces' of past actions that exert an influence upon our present actions and decisions. Thus, a promise made gives rise to an obligation that continues to exist so long as the promise remains unfulfilled (101), or the past behavior of a tyrant, e.g., kidnapping one's parents, causes one to make a number of current decisions (104). These features of prakta and the worldly 'togetherness' underlying them ground the reality of a moral world shared by practically rational beings regardless of what specific values they adopt.

It is important to stress that for Kontos the entities constituting the shared moral realm, prakta, are essentially the results of previous actions; they are 'what have been brought about by action'. In the first chapter of the book Kontos argues that this is primarily how Aristotle also viewed prakta. His argument relies upon an analysis of the notion of a decree, a paradigmatic Aristotelian prakton. Kontos insists that decrees do not function as starting points for future political action because more often than not they lead to productions (poiēseis), not actions (praxeis), e.g., the erection of a temple. Instead, they are viewed by Aristotle as essentially the results of political action: 'above/before decrees lies only the law and under/after decrees, there is nothing' (13).

As an interpretation of Aristotle I think this proposal is unsuccessful because it relies upon an overly rigid conception of the action/production distinction. Aristotle is willing to view narrowly productive activities as the actions of practical authorities provided that the former are ordered and directed by the relevant authorities. (Compare his conception of the relation between a master and the productive activities of his slaves, cf. Pol. I.4 1253b27-1254a8 with VII.4 1325b21-3.) However, as a philosophical proposal it is of interest because it allows Kontos to stress freshly that our current actions and decisions are part of a larger causal nexus that extends into the past (and future).

Chapter two is a close analysis of Aristotle's treatment of phronetic perception in NE VI. Kontos argues against an influential orthodoxy that conceives phronetic perception as a kind of intellectual vision. He argues instead that Aristotle treats it as analogous to perception of common sensibles. His most novel proposal in the chapter, which is facilitated by the analogy with perception of common sensibles, is that phronetic perception can be viewed from two complementary perspectives. The first 'regressive' approach views phronetic perception as intimately tied to a specific sort of upbringing and ethical outlook. In this role phronetic perception is an aid to practical deliberation and action. (This is the perspective that most readers of Aristotle will find familiar.) The second 'progressive' perspective views phronetic perception more generally as a type of perception, independent of any particular ethical outlook, that gives one access to a shared moral world. It is a stretch to attribute a clear acknowledgement of this second perspective to Aristotle; but it is of the utmost importance for Kontos' own philosophical project, for it opens the door to a sort of moral realism that is independent of any particular ethical outlook (contrary to the particularism of McDowell) but is not extra-ethical (contrary to bald naturalism).

In chapter three Kontos takes up Aristotle's 'constructivism', i.e., his attempt to justify moral principles on the basis of an 'ontological' inquiry into the nature of moral action. Kontos takes Aristotle's treatments of badness (understood as treating pleasure as the apparent good) and intemperance as case studies and argues that he thinks these vices manifest confusion about the nature of pleasure and action respectively. A nice upshot of this argument is that we see more clearly why 'theoretical' treatments of moral action and pleasure have a place in the 'practical' treatise of the NE, viz., because they help practical agents guard against various errors that may lead to viciousness. This chapter may seem irrelevant to Kontos' aim of developing a new form of moral realism, but the appearance is mistaken. In addition to showing how moral experience gives direct access to a shared moral world, Kontos intends to establish that it also yields formal moral principles that are invariant across distinct ethical outlooks (1). In chapter three Kontos appeals to Aristotle's procedure in the NE to support the prospects of such an endeavor. This intimate connection between 'ontology' and 'axiology' is also supported by his discussion of Kant in the next chapter.

In the fourth chapter Kontos examines Kant's treatment of the categories of freedom in the Critique of Practical Reason. He argues that those categories are not simply pure forms of judgment that formally determine the moral law; they are special categories of moral action that are necessary for the possibility of the experience of free actions as appearances in the sensible world. Thus, the categories of freedom play an ontological role in granting accessibility to a morally evaluable world. But Kontos also stresses that they play for Kant an axiological role in grounding the concepts of good and evil and with them rules of moral salience.

With chapter five Kontos leaves the first, primarily exegetical part of the book behind and proceeds to develop his own novel form of phenomenological moral realism drawing upon the insights of the previous chapters. His guiding thought is that any specific moral evaluation or outlook presupposes as a condition of its possibility experience of a shared moral world. If we were only capable of an outlook-specific form of moral experience, as we are, say, in McDowell's framework, we would only have access to 'corners' of a moral world. Thus, as Kontos sees it, his main task is to explain the possibility of moral experience of a shared or common moral reality. Accordingly, he argues that a condition for the possibility of such a world is materiality or 'togetherness' (roughly, a sort of unity of agents, their goals, means, etc.) provided by a synthesis of the categories of practical reason.

The appearances that manifest themselves within this unified reality are prakta, the 'visibile' and 'solid' traces of previous actions. By stressing the centrality of such prakta in his own framework, Kontos is able to emphasize the moral significance of our past accomplishments: 'the moral world is not only the scene of a struggle for the sake of realizing new actions and new ends, but also and primordially a world with a certain solidity thanks to our achievements.' (104). This insight also yields a fresh perspective on the role that the self ought to play in our ethical thought. For Kontos the self is not the 'privileged place' of moral significance (108). Like any other morally evaluable item, it must be experienced as a prakton of our shared moral world.

In the next three chapters Kontos examines alternative phenomenological treatments of moral experience, arguing that they all deprive it of orientation to a shared moral reality. Chapter six is an examination of Heidegger's interpretations of Aristotelian and Kantian ethics. Kontos insists that although Heidegger correctly acknowledges the importance of a phenomenological analysis of moral experience and its 'togetherness', he annuls his insight by modeling the experience of the moral world on that of the self. In chapter seven Kontos argues that Gadamer's essentially Heideggerian treatment of practical reason has the same unfortunate consequence. In the eighth chapter Kontos turns to Arendt's view of actions and performances. He argues that, contrary to some misleading impressions, we should refrain from ascribing to her a pure performativity thesis according to which virtuous actions merely display virtuousity, because that thesis is incompatible with her principle of plurality. This move renders Arendt's phenomenology of action compatible in principle with Kontos' view that prakta are traces inscribed in the moral world. However, like the other phenomenologists, Arendt overlooks the perceptual model of moral experience and consequently fails to vindicate our access to a shared moral world.

The concluding chapter situates Kontos' moral realism within the analytical tradition to which it is supposed to contribute. The moral realism that he proposes is a form of internal moral realism, because the reality to which phronetic perception yields access is only accessible to beings endowed with phronetic perception. It is also a normative realism, because it takes seriously moral experience as a source of formal ethical principles. Finally, Kontos' moral realism is a 'theoretical' realism insofar as it is developed in accordance with the presumption that contemporary ethical theorizing cannot be effectively divorced from the analysis of the history of ethics.

Kontos' engagement with the diverse range of topics covered in the book is truly admirable, and one cannot help but feel that he is onto something deep and important. In particular, his attempt to counteract the solipsistic slant of many contemporary ethical frameworks is extremely refreshing and insightful. Readers versed in continental philosophy and phenomenology specifically are likely to have an easier time working their way into Kontos' framework because of the abundance of phenomenological jargon peppered throughout the book. By contrast, analytic philosophers are likely to find that feature of the book and the absence of well-developed examples frustrating. As with any other ambitious book, readers will find much in it with which to agree and disagree. For my taste, however, the biggest disappointment is Kontos' treatment (or lack thereof) of how moral experience gives rise to formal moral principles.

As I pointed out above, Kontos sets as a major goal the validation of moral experience's status as a 'first principle on the basis of which we can establish criteria of evaluation for moral actions and moral agents' (1). He attempts to accomplish this task by appealing to the authority of Aristotle and Kant and their shared presumption that an ontology of moral experience can effectively ground formal moral principles: 'in echoing Aristotle's and Kant's insights, I feel entitled to maintain that the correctness/falsity of practical principles can be confirmed by means of pointing out the correctness/falsity of relevant ontological claims about the status of actions and deeds' (158). To be sure, Kontos' discussions of Aristotle's and Kant's treatments of this issue in chapters three and four are interesting from an historical perspective; but they yield very little payoff for his own philosophical project. After reading those chapters the reader is still left with the lingering question of whether and if so how this intimate connection between 'ontology' and 'axiology' plays out within Kontos' own peculiar ethical framework.

Unfortunately, however, that question is never squarely addressed in the remaining sections. Chapter five, which is the crux of the work, is devoted to explaining how via phronetic perception practically rational beings have access to a shared moral reality; and the next three chapters are devoted to establishing that alternative phenomenological frameworks deprive us of access to such a reality. Kontos never undertakes to explain what specific moral principles are yielded by his ontology of prakta or what mistaken moral principles people are tricked into accepting by ignoring that ontology. Kontos' failure to address this issue from within his own philosophical framework is a veritable shortcoming of the book given his own list of desiderata for it (1). Nonetheless, the book contains enough food for thought to keep even the most voracious philosophical appetite engaged and stimulated.