Aristotle's Anthropology

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Geert Keil and Nora Kreft (eds.), Aristotle's Anthropology, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 295pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107192690.

Reviewed by Robert Howton, Koç University


According to its editors, Geert Keil and Nora Kreft, the aim of this collection is "to study the various intriguing and sometimes curious observations Aristotle makes about human beings" (4), an effort they hope will "shed light" on the relations among the characteristics Aristotle takes to be uniquely human and help "explore their importance for the rest of Aristotle's philosophy" (5). The thirteen essays collected in the volume more than meet this aim, not only examining an impressive array of Aristotle's observations about human nature, but in many cases offering fresh perspectives on much-discussed passages and problems and, in some instances, making important contributions to ongoing debates over the status of an Aristotelian science of human nature. The volume will be a resource for specialists in Aristotle's natural science and practical philosophy as well as for non-specialists interested in Aristotelian conceptions of human nature, especially as they relate to current philosophical controversies over the "anthropological difference" separating humans from non-human animals.

The volume is divided into four parts: Parts I and II concern, respectively, "the metaphysics and biology of human nature", while Parts III and IV are devoted to "the anthropological foundations and implications of Aristotle's ethico-political works" (16). Thematic continuity extends throughout the volume, however, and readers will discover instructive connections between chapters in all four of its parts.

Among the most significant themes are two highlighted by Keil and Kreft in their substantive introduction: Aristotle's definition of human beings and his position on the anthropological difference. Aristotle is often supposed to have defined human beings as rational animals. But although this account superficially conforms to the genus-plus-final-differentia definitional structure defended in the Topics and Metaphysics, there are at least two reasons for doubting that Aristotle intends it as such. First, as Christian Kietzmann points out in "Aristotle on the Definition of What It Is to Be Human", the textual evidence that Aristotle accepted such a definition of human beings is surprisingly weak. The best candidate is perhaps Politics 1.2, where Aristotle cites in support of the conclusion that human beings are the most political animals the fact that we alone among animals have logos (1253a9-10). While in certain contexts 'logos' is appropriately rendered in English as 'reason' or 'rationality', Kietzmann argues that here it must mean 'speech', since the intended contrast with human logos is voice (phonē), which Aristotle also attributes to non-rational animals.

The conclusion that human beings are not defined as rational animals in Politics 1.2 relies on the premise that even if Aristotle takes speech and reason to be intimately linked, still the capacity for speech is distinct from the capacity for reason. This premise, which Kietzmann accepts (27), receives an extended defense in Ian C. McCready-Flora's "Speech and the Rational Soul". According to McCready-Flora, the distinction between speech and reason follows from Aristotle's commitment to a more general principle of "Cognitive Priority" (CP), according to which "a creature's having some cognitive power explains their having the means to realise it" (47). CP forces a distinction between speech and reason, McCready-Flora claims, because for Aristotle linguistic symbols are tools for rational cognition (logismos). However, as Hans-Johann Glock brings out in "Aristotle on the Anthropological Difference and Animal Minds" (158-160), there is a crucial ambiguity in the nature of the difference CP posits between cognitive capacities and their instruments. McCready-Flora's conclusion is that speech is neither constitutive of nor necessary for rational cognition (57). Rather, for Aristotle CP also establishes the explanatory priority of cognitive capacities over instruments whose employment partially constitutes the realization of the capacity: the flautist's art is explanatorily prior to flutes (PA 4.10, 687a8-14), yet the former could hardly be exercised or even understood without reference to the latter. So even if it can be deduced from other passages in the corpus that Aristotle thinks we can reason without the use of language (e.g., as McCready-Flora contends, from SE 1, 165a13-17 and 7, 169a36-b2), CP itself provides no support for a merely instrumental relation between speech and reason.

Whatever the connection between speech and reason, Kietzmann argues that a second and deeper reason why Aristotle does not define human beings as rational animals is that there cannot be a definition of human beings. Definitions are the explanatory primitives of Aristotelian science. In this role they both function as the starting points of demonstrative explanation within the science and indicate disciplinary boundaries: since "the unity of a science is achieved through the unity of the genos under which its terms fall", Kietzmann argues that "we should expect a definition to contain only terms that fall under the genos delimiting the reach of the science in which that definition serves as a first principle" (36). Aristotle evidently thinks of the distinctive features of human animals as consequences of our unique rationality. Human intelligence, reason, and nous are variously cited in explanations of distinctively human physical traits, such as our upright posture and possession of hands (PA 4.10, 686a25-29), as well as psychological traits, such as our unique ability to recollect (Mem. 2, 453a4-10; HA 1.1, 488b25-27); and they provide the foundation for his ethics and political philosophy (see below).[1] But taking humans to be distinguished from other animals by their possession of reason seems to rule out the possibility of defining human beings from terms falling under a single genus. The study of animals belongs to the science of nature, the science of what is changeable and ontologically inseparable from matter (Metaph. 6.1, 1026a7-23). But as Aristotle reminds us even in these contexts (PA 4.10, 688a27-32; EN 10.7, 1177b30-31), nous is something divine and, in some respects at least, does not seem to admit of change; and to this extent it belongs not to natural science but to theology, the science of what is unchangeable and ontologically separate from matter. For Kietzmann, this shows not only that human beings are not the subject of a single science, but also that we are "ontologically divided" in a way that makes a complete definitional account of human nature impossible (43).

Aristotle hardly denies that the theoretical study of human nature exceeds the limits of natural science. To the contrary, as James G. Lennox argues in "Is Reason Natural? Aristotle's Zoology of Rational Animals", Aristotle makes human beings a central focus of his study of animals and applies the results of this study to practical philosophy even while acknowledging that the human capacity for reason transcends natural science. But Aristotle would not obviously accept that human beings are ontologically divided in a way that precludes the possibility of a definition. Like other substances, human beings form a unity, and in Aristotle's view part of the work of definitions is to account for the unity of what they define (APo. 2.6, 92a27-33; Metaph. 7.12, 1037b24-37). So if there can be no "complete" definition of human beings, there arises the question of what accounts for the fact that a human being is one and not many (cf. Metaph. 8.6, 1045a8-20).

Several contributors offer suggestions that may help to allay this worry. Perhaps, as Kreft and Keil suggest, definition is possible within the context of a unified "hybrid", practical-cum-theoretical science of human nature (4). One way of spelling out this proposal is adeptly explored by Jörn Müller in "Spot the Differences! The Hidden Philosophical Anthropology in Aristotle's Biological Writings". According to Müller, a definition of human beings must take into account the "teleological essentialism" of Aristotle's biology. This requires appreciation not only of functional differences among the various capacities we share with non-human animals, but also of the distinctive teleological structure in which those capacities are embedded, a structure that can only be understood in light of the distinctively human function explored most fully in Aristotle's practical philosophical works (138). A different approach is proposed by Elena Cagnoli Fiecconi, who argues in "Aristotle's Peculiarly Human Psychology" that what is peculiar to the human soul, and what therefore gives a unified subject-matter to Aristotle's ethico-political investigations, is that in the human soul alone there exists rational and non-rational parts that "interact" and "cooperate" in various ways (see 75-76 for a summary of these interactions and their results for human psychology). On both proposals, we might say, the unity of human nature arises from the ontological divide separating our animal and divine natures.

These proposals bring into clear focus the second major theme highlighted in Kreft and Keil's Introduction: Aristotle's position on the "anthropological difference" separating humans from non-human animals. Modern approaches to the anthropological difference have tended to be either differentialist, acknowledging a qualitative, categorical difference between human and non-human animals, or assimilationist, denying any but gradual and quantitative differences (cf. Glock, 143). Aristotle, however, seems to fit comfortably into neither camp, for although he seems to acknowledge that our distinctive possession of nous makes human cognitive achievements different in kind from those of non-human animals (HA 8.1, 588a25-31), he also thinks that nature progresses "continuously" (sunechōs, PA 4.5, 681a11) or "little by little" (kata mikron, HA 8.1, 588b4-5) from lifeless bodies to the most complex forms of animal life. While it may be possible to read Aristotle as unequivocally committed to one or the other modern approach -- Glock, for instance, reads Aristotle as a differentialist while acknowledging that his approach is nevertheless "Janus-faced" (143) -- the evident difficulty of classifying his position can also be seen as a basis for criticizing the dichotomy between differentialism and assimilationism as it is standardly conceived. According to a recent critical approach directly inspired by Aristotle,[2] differentialists often presuppose an additive conception of rationality, according to which human reason is one psychological faculty among many, some of which we share with non-human animals (such as perception). However, it is also possible for differentialists to think of rationality as transformative of human beings' other faculties, so that it is not possible to attribute any psychological faculty to both human and non-human animals without equivocation (see Keil's discussion in the Introduction, 7-16). On a transformative conception of rationality, then, commitment to a scala naturae of the sort Aristotle evinces is not evidence for assimilation but in fact compatible with differentialism, for the superficially gradual progression to more advanced forms of life could conceal transformative changes in the capacities common to rational and non-rational animals.

Aristotle never explicitly endorses a transformative conception of rationality, but Keil argues that we find "particular instances of this line of thought" in his texts (8). As a case in point Keil offers Fiecconi's view that the peculiar ability of humans to combine images in deliberative phantasia is due to "cooperation" between non-rational cognition and the rational part of the soul (60). However, a transformative conception of rationality implies more than interaction or cooperation among rational and non-rational faculties, for even if these faculties are "built to cooperate" in human beings, as Fiecconi suggests, there is not yet reason to believe that this requires an essential or definitional difference in the relevant faculties as they appear in human and non-human animals. To the contrary, there is reason to believe that faculties such as perception must be the same in definition in human and non-human animals, inasmuch as Aristotle seems to assume that a scientific definition of the perceptive faculty can be applied to the understanding of both the human and the non-human animal soul (cf. DA 2.3, 414b32-415a13). If so, then the differences that Fiecconi takes to arise from the cooperation of rational and non-rational faculties should coincide with a gradualist account of the differences in the non-rational faculties that make such cooperation possible (cf. Müller's account of deliberative phantasia, 130).

The themes highlighted in Kreft and Keil's Introduction feature less prominently in Parts III and IV, which turn from definitional and biological matters to the anthropological foundations of Aristotle's ethico-political treatises, though these themes are not wholly absent. In "Why Human Virtue Is the Measure of All Virtue", Kathi Beier objects against "functionalist" readings of Aristotle's ethics that not everything with a function has a virtue in the strict, unequivocal sense: "it is due to the special nature of human beings -- of their being simultaneously animal-like and god-like -- that Aristotle believes that humans alone can be virtuous in the proper sense of the term" (181). The ethical significance of what Beier calls our "highly complex and heterogeneous form" (180) is also stressed earlier in the volume by Christof Rapp, who in "The Planetary Nature of Mankind: A Cosmological Perspective on Aristotle's Anthropology" exploits an Aristotelian analogy between human beings and the wandering planets to shed light on the unique practical and ethical possibilities available to us. Like the planets, our nature shares to some extent in that of the divine but is also "remote" from it, and for this reason we, like the planets, must engage in "multifarious actions and activities" (90) -- and additionally face the possibility of failure -- in order to achieve the highest good. I doubt, however, that this sort of complexity restricts virtue proper to human beings in the way Beier claims: even if "Aristotle defines virtue as a hexis" or disposition, and even if human nature exemplifies in the extreme the complexity of heterogeneous parts of which dispositions are stable arrangements, it does not follow that other, less complex and heterogeneous natures can have only "virtues by analogy" (180). For what prevents other, less complex natures from having virtuous dispositions commensurate with their degree of complexity, a difference with human virtue that could plausibly be understood as gradual rather than qualitative?

A highlight of the volume is "Aristotle on Friendship and Being Human", in which Kreft makes a persuasive case that Aristotle regards the capacity for "proper" or virtue friendship as "not just a uniquely human feature, but an essential one" (182). It is unique because virtue friends "must value each other for their own sakes" by taking pleasure in perceiving each other's virtue as such (193), a criterion which, given humanity's peculiar capacity to perceive good and bad, makes virtue friendship "an essentially human kind of relationship" (194). More strikingly, virtue friendship is also "an essential relationship for human beings" (ibid.), since being fully human means actualizing nous and, as Kreft argues, Aristotle thinks "we need to share nous in order to actualize nous" (198), a form of community shared by all and only virtue friends. (Why Aristotle thinks exercising nous requires sharing nous is a question Kreft leaves open.)

Christoph Horn's "Aristotle on the Possibility of Moral Perfection" also focuses on Aristotle's conception of the virtuous agent, arguing that Aristotle's ethically ideal state is one of "unrestricted moral perfection" comparable more to the Stoic sophos than the Platonic philosophos (202). But the comparison is imperfect, for although Horn thinks Aristotle's ethical ideal is captured in the idea of a divinely perfect virtuous agent, he concedes that "cognitive infallibility is not part of the Aristotelian ideal" (212) and that virtuous agents have only "fallible perfection" in the assessment of morally relevant facts (211).

Two of the three final chapters consider the anthropology of Aristotle's Politics. In "Political Animals and Human Nature in Aristotle's Politics", another highlight of the collection, Joseph Karbowski builds on a fruitful literature drawing on Aristotle's biological discussions of political animals to clarify his conception of human "politicality". According to Karbowski, we share two features of "broadly political" animals that have so far gone unnoticed in this literature: functional division into role-differentiated subkinds (in the human case, freemen, women, and natural slaves) and coordinated diversity, a corresponding morphological and psychological differentiation of subkinds according to functional role (in the human case, the role of each in the household and polis). He argues that both traits are a consequence of natural teleology, specifically nature's desire to make humanity adequate to the demands of life in a polis, and concludes on this basis that Aristotle conceives of human beings as shaped mutually by our rational and our political natures. For just as "the rational perfection that constitutes happiness will have an important influence upon the structure of the polis", "our political nature impacts the way that rationality is distributed throughout the species" (236).

In "Political Animals and the Genealogy of the Polis: Aristotle's Politics and Plato's Statesman", David J. Depew explores Aristotle's dialectical engagement with Plato's Statesman in the Politics. Depew argues for a connection between Aristotle's logical and methodological objections to the Platonic method of division, which is featured heavily in the Statesman, and his dissatisfaction with Plato's conceptions of the ideal state in the Republic and Laws. For Depew, what Aristotle finds objectionable about Plato's ideal cities is that "activity in accord with virtue is collapsed into the single, rather passive virtue of self-control (sōphrosynē)", or "not much more than sōphrosynē", a feature Depew diagnoses as Plato's "thinking of humans too much as herd and not enough as political animals" (250) and traces to a crucial step of the division of statecraft in Statesman 260c-267d. On his view, then, Aristotle's Politics is not only a philosophical response to Plato, an attempt to describe a polis that can achieve the goals of political association that Plato's ideal cities failed to achieve; it is also a methodological response "conforming to Aristotle's reform of division in his zoological treatises" (255).

The collection receives a fitting conclusion with Dorothea Frede's "The Deficiency of Human Nature: The Task of a 'Philosophy of Human Affairs'", which considers the scope and aims of the "philosophy of human affairs" (EN 10.9, 1181b15) to which Aristotle devotes the Nicomachean Ethics and Politics, addressing in particular its role in the project of ordering political communities. Frede argues that Aristotle envisages this project as one of compensating for the limitations of humanity's natural sociability through a regimen of moral and intellectual education prescribed and instituted by law-givers. However, the philosophy of human affairs is not the architectonic science that aims at the good for human beings (EN 1.2, 1094a18-b7), but rather the discipline that "provides the philosophical underpinnings of such a master science" (266). The task of a philosophy of human affairs, Frede concludes, is not to make human beings good, but "to give help to those with an interest, ambition, and the potential to become politicians, by instructing them on the basic philosophical principles of their discipline" (271).

Non-specialists will appreciate the measures taken by the editors to keep the volume accessible, for instance transliterating even long quotations of Aristotle's Greek. Specialists however will notice the absence of an index locorum, which would have been especially useful for a collection such as this, in which a relatively small set of key passages receive extended discussion in several chapters. Still, given the high quality of the essays and their rich thematic interconnection, the volume will be a valuable resource for further study of Aristotle's philosophy of human nature.


I am grateful to Larkin Philpot for helpful comments on an earlier draft.

[1] The volume is rich in examples of human beings' distinctive features drawn from throughout the corpus; see e.g. the collections of idia compiled by the editors (4-5), Kietzmann (31), and Lennox (99-100).

[2] See esp. Matthew Boyle, "Additive Theories of Rationality: A Critique", European Journal of Philosophy 24, no. 3 (2016): 527-555 and "A Different Kind of Mind?", in The Routledge Handbook of Philosophy of Animal Minds, eds. Kristin Andrews and Jacob Beck (New York and London: Routledge, 2018), 109-118.