Aristotle's Concept of Mind

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Erick Raphael Jiménez, Aristotle's Concept of Mind, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 265pp., $99.99, ISBN 9781108151825.

Reviewed by Matthew D. Walker, Yale-NUS College


Erick Raphael Jiménez articulates a systematic account of Aristotle's view of mind (nous). He translates the Greek nous as "mind" on the grounds that other translations, such as "intellect," portray nous as a faculty (p. 12). Jiménez rejects this portrayal: nous is "not simply a naturally given faculty for the perception of a certain sort of perceptible" (p. 16), and "not possessed simply 'by nature'" (p. 44). On the contrary, Jiménez holds -- as his book's first main thesis -- that mind is a "virtue rather than a natural capacity" (p. 7), "a state of intellectual excellence, and not a potentiality like sensation" (p. 33). Nous is attained through actively coming to understand: "Mind and understanding are not potentialities predating their development; they are habits earned through learning and discovery" (p. 29; cf. pp. 30-31). In articulating what he calls his "actuality-first" account of nous (p. 8), Jiménez offers close readings of De Anima III and other Aristotelian texts.

In chapter 1, Jiménez re-reads De Anima III.4, which might seem to portray nous as a faculty akin to sensation. Against this reading, Jiménez argues, De Anima III.4 aims at undermining the claim that thought is like sensation (p. 18). In defending his reading, Jiménez highlights all the problems that emerge from the nous/sensation analogy. For instance, he contends, sensation is a completely developed capacity prior to its actualization, whereas nous requires learning. Sensation requires something external to act on sensation. But nous does not: one can think whenever one likes (pp. 23; 27-29; 31).

Chapters 2-3 explore the nous/body relation. Chapter 2 argues that Aristotelian psychology cannot explain why there are minds, other than by describing what is hypothetically necessary at the material level for minds to exist. Since nous, on Jiménez's view, is a virtue and not a natural faculty, Aristotle's explanations of nous must differ in kind from his accounts of nutrition and sensation, which are natural faculties (and which are explicable, in part, by reference to their utility for survival). Chapter 3 carefully examines the main De Anima passages that seem to support the view that nous is "separate" qua disembodied. Jiménez argues vigorously against nous's disembodiment; he also provides general positive arguments for thinking that nous must be embodied.

Chapter 4 offers an extended commentary on De Anima III.5's notoriously contested discussion of active nous. Jiménez denies that active and passive nous are two different minds. He also denies that active nous is a divine mind. Instead, Jiménez reads the active/passive distinction as signifying two "moments or acts" of the same mind (p. 72). Nous qua active makes things intelligible; qua passive, nous perceives what active nous makes intelligible. Or, as Jiménez puts the point, "Active mind makes something thinkable, and passive mind thinks it" (p. 85; original italics). Similarly, the potential for thinking is produced through active nous: "Potential minds are created by actual thinking" (p. 109).

Jiménez goes on to defend a second main thesis: that nous's correlative objects are thought-independent, but not qua thinkable. Here, Jiménez challenges "abstractionist" readings according to which Aristotle, again, models nous on sensation and holds that nous reveals the world's already-given intelligibility, by abstracting intelligible forms from what we sense (see, e.g., pp. 4-5; 114). According to Jiménez, the abstractionist assumes, first, a metaphysical determinacy claim, that nous's objects are forms that nous abstracts. The abstractionist assumes, second, an epistemological determinacy claim, that how nous grasps its objects is epistemologically fixed, such that all cases of abstracting forms are instances of a determinate psychological type (pp. 114; 137). In denying that De Anima III.4 models thinking on sensation, Jiménez sets the stage for rejecting abstractionism as early as chapter 1. In chapters 5-6, however, he considers nous's objects in more detail. He challenges abstractionism by attacking the two determinacy claims that he thinks this view assumes.

In chapter 5, on essence and form in Metaphysics Z.4-8, Jiménez rejects the metaphysical determinacy claim about nous's proper objects. For his Aristotle, mind's objects "are not metaphysically characterizable in terms of form and/or matter," but instead "in relations of priority and posteriority" (p. 162). Minds, on this reading, do not grasp (intelligible) forms; instead, they grasp prior-posterior causal/explanatory relations. What is prior in any given context will have "formal" features; but what is prior need not be a form (p. 131). In chapter 6, on Posterior Analytics II.19, Jiménez commits Aristotle to epistemological indeterminacy about how nous grasps principles. Aristotle's view, he says, is particularist (p. 157).

According to Jiménez's third main thesis, Aristotle commits himself to a "time-perception model" of thinking, the main features of which Jiménez develops in chapters 7-9. In a nutshell, thinking is like perceiving time: "the inferential structure underlying time perception holds constitutively for thinking, too" (p. 191).

Jiménez lays the foundations of this model in chapter 5's argument that priority/posteriority relations, instead of forms, serve as nous's objects. He further motivates this model with chapter 6's account of understanding. Thinking, Jiménez maintains, has a certain inferential structure. In understanding eclipses, for instance, we understand how the posterior follows from what is prior by discerning an explanatory principle, which serves as a medium. Chapter 7 adds to this model by examining Physics IV.10-14's discussion of time. Time-perception, Jiménez argues, involves a broadly inferential perception of the unity of the prior and the posterior through a medium. He further proposes that time-perception serves as an innate capacity through which we develop the power to think (pp. 183-186). By appealing to time-perception, then, Jiménez aims to explain how nous can emerge and develop without itself being an innate capacity.

Chapter 8 fills in Jiménez's account of the time-boundedness of perception and understanding. Chapter 9 examines truth and meaning from the perspective of the time-perception model. "Truth in meaning is a matter of representing a connection between subject and attribute in an appropriate time frame" (p. 243).

As my brief overview should suggest, Jiménez has written an ambitious account of Aristotle on nous and thinking. His work combines systematic scope with close readings of some of Aristotle's most obscure passages. Jiménez's discussion integrates a wide range of topics from throughout the Aristotelian corpus, and brings together aspects of Aristotle's philosophy usually discussed separately (in particular, the De Anima's account of thinking, the Metaphysics' account of essences, and the Physics' account of time). Along the way, Jiménez offers valuable insights about specific issues in Aristotle's philosophy of mind and related topics. These insights include chapter 3's compelling discussion and defense of nous's embodiment, and chapter 6's judicious discussion of rationalist and empiricist readings of how knowers grasp principles. Jiménez is often imaginative in highlighting unexpected parallels between thinking and time-perception in chapters 7-9. Regardless of whether they ultimately accept his main theses, scholars will find these particular discussions stimulating. Finally, Jiménez consistently signposts his argument for the reader. He includes a detailed introduction, helpful conclusions, and useful road maps between sections. Jiménez writes in an even style in which he aims to articulate his main theses clearly.

What, however, should we make of Jiménez's account? His interpretation will be controversial, and readers, I suspect, will take issue with any number of its particular claims. For the most part, Jiménez proceeds by offering close readings of specific passages. He presents his interpretations straightforwardly, and without always addressing alternative readings or touching on debates from the existing secondary literature. (When he does consider scholarly debates, as in chapter 6's discussion of empiricist vs. rationalist readings of Posterior Analytics II.19, he often makes interesting points.) This feature enables Jiménez to present his systematic account as an interlocking whole without losing the forest for the trees. On the other hand, this approach will leave some readers unpersuaded by his specific readings.

One key point on which I have yet to be sold is Jiménez's first main thesis, that nous is not a natural faculty or capacity, but a virtue. Aristotle does, to be sure, identify nous as a virtue in Nicomachean Ethics VI.6. Here, nous is the excellence in virtue of which we comprehend first principles. On this basis, Jiménez claims that, according to Nicomachean Ethics VI, nous is "not at all a potentiality possessed prior to its exercise" (p. 31). As Jiménez reasonably insists (p. 30n22), Posterior Analytics II.19 also discusses nous in the sense of a virtuous state. Yet Aristotle suggests that virtues are states (hexeis) in virtue of which things exercise their functional capacities well. So, if nous is a virtue, what capacity does it enable to function well? Of what, exactly, is the virtue of nous a virtue?

From what Aristotle says, nous (qua virtue) is an excellence of the authoritatively rational part of the soul discussed in Nicomachean Ethics I.7 and I.13, Eudemian Ethics II.1, and Politics VII.14. Such is the part of the soul, Aristotle says, to which the various intellectual virtues pertain (EN I.13, 1103a3-10; VI.1, 1139a5-17). The intellectual excellences are states in virtue of which this authoritatively rational part (in its practical and theoretical dimensions) functions well in attaining truth (EN VI.2, 1139b12-13). But then, we face the question of accounting for this authoritatively rational part, which Aristotle does seem to portray as a natural faculty. The Eudemian Ethics, for instance, shares Nicomachean Ethics VI's treatise on the intellectual virtues. And in Eudemian Ethics II.1, Aristotle recognizes that talk of "parts" of the soul is controversial; hence, he clarifies that by "parts," he means powers (dunameis) of the soul (1219b32-36). This rational part, then, would seem to be that power of the soul by which the soul thinks. But "that portion of the soul by which" the soul thinks is just how Aristotle describes nous (De Anima III.4, 429a10-11; cf. 429a23). If so, then Aristotle would seem to view nous not only as an intellectual virtue. He would also seem to identify nous (in a different sense) as a psychic faculty, i.e., as that power of the soul whose function is attaining truth.[1]

Moreover, contrary to Jiménez, Aristotle would seem to view nous as an innate faculty, at least if the Aristotelian Problems XXX.5 conveys Aristotle's view. Like the human hand -- which we possess naturally from birth, but whose use we must develop -- "nous is also among the things belonging in us by nature as an instrument" (955b25-26). Even if Aristotle himself did not write Problems XXX.5, the chapter provides evidence of how nous was understood within his school. (Nous's usefulness as a natural faculty, to which this chapter alludes, would also explain, in part, why human beings possess minds -- contrary to some of Jiménez's suggestions in chapter 2 [pp. 9; 41-45].[2])

One who thinks that nous is an innate faculty of soul can still accept that to perfect nous, we must engage in research and learning. Thus, one skeptical about Jiménez's first main thesis can still accept, if in a weaker way, Jiménez's general thought that "mind is what it is through thinking" (see, e.g., 109). We must exercise our intellectual faculties to actualize them fully. But one can still question the bolder claims that "prior to learning or discovery, there is no such thing as having a mind, in the strict sense" (p. 30), that "we are not born with minds" (p. 109), and that potential minds "are created by actual thinking" (p. 109; original italics).

Similarly, I am skeptical about Jiménez's reading of De Anima III.4 as a reductio of the analogy between nous and sensation. Jiménez is very good at identifying differences between sensation and nous that come to light in that chapter and elsewhere (e.g., in De Anima II.5). Thus, one can agree, with qualification, that "Aristotle here shows that mind cannot be a potentiality in the way that sensation is" (p. 26). But perhaps all Aristotle is saying is that nous does not assimilate forms in just the same way that sensation does, and that thought's specific mode of being affected by its objects differs from sensation's. If so, nous may still remain broadly analogous to sensation, as assimilative of form. If sensation (a lower capacity) approximates thinking (a higher capacity), and if what approximates something inevitably differs from that which it approximates, then these disanalogies are reasonable and inevitable.

Likewise, Jiménez's reading of De Anima III.5 invites challenge. The chapter (infamously) highlights active nous's separateness, unaffectedness, unmixedness, actuality, honorableness, uninterrupted thinking, immortality, and eternity. Jiménez suggests ways to understand these attributes within the framework of his account.  For instance, he proposes that nous is immortal and eternal (i) in the restricted sense that it cognizes eternal truths and (ii) insofar as nous is identical to its thoughts (pp. 103-104). In my view, however, Alexandrian readings, according to which De Anima III.5's active nous is Metaphysics XII's Unmoved Mover, do a better job of elucidating the chapter. As Victor Caston notes, every feature of active nous that Aristotle mentions in De Anima III.5 is one that Metaphysics XII.7-9 attributes to divine thinking.[3]

Jiménez proposes that De Anima III is explanatorily prior to Metaphysics XII: the latter conditionally introduces a divine mind to explain eternal motion and cosmic order; but the former is concerned with mind itself (pp. 106-107). Yet if the divine thinking of Metaphysics XII is a final cause for everything (including human thinking); if it actualizes thought in an eternally active and paradigmatic way; and if, indeed, it possesses all the attributes that De Anima III.5 attributes to active nous, then Metaphysics XII would seem to have a certain explanatory priority over De Anima III.5. Jiménez is correct, however, that any reading of De Anima III.5 is inevitably interpretive and controversial (p. 74); and Jiménez's "two moments" reading offers an interesting contribution to the debate.

In sum, I recommend Jiménez's book to specialists on Aristotle's psychology. They will find much in his account that is novel and provocative. And given his systematic approach, such readers will benefit from seeing links between different aspects of Aristotle's philosophy -- links that Jiménez's interpretation brings to the fore and that deserve more examination than I have been able to give them here. Jiménez's work should spur on further thought about these difficult issues.

[1] Jiménez apparently grants that nous is a virtue of the rational part and that human beings possess a rational part by nature (p. 185). But if this rational part is responsible for our thinking, and if this part bears the whole set of intellectual virtues, one can ask why we should not simply identify nous, in the sense of a faculty, as this rational part.

[2] I explore nous’s utility in Aristotle on the Uses of Contemplation (Cambridge University Press, in press).

[3] Victor Caston, “Aristotle’s Two Intellects: A Modest Proposal,” Phronesis 44 (1999), pp. 211-212.